The Nature of Desert Claims: Rethinking What it Means to Get One’s Due

The Nature Of Desert Claims

Kevin Kinghorn, The Nature of Desert Claims: Rethinking What it Means to Get One’s Due, Cambridge University Press, 2021, 227pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108845328.

Reviewed by Spencer Case, University of Colorado Boulder


Everyday language is replete with talk about who deserves what, but desert in contemporary moral philosophy seems always to be playing second or third fiddle to such concepts as obligation and justice. Perhaps desert itself deserves more attention from philosophers. Kevin Kinghorn thinks that it does. In this book he attempts to give it its due. Kinghorn contends that recent work on desert has been stuck in a false model that overlooks the way that desert attributions publicly draw attention to important truths about their objects.

In Chapter 1, Kinghorn discusses some incidents in sports that highlight the distinction between desert and entitlement. One of these occurred in the final 1,000-meter short-track speed skating at the 2002 Winter Olympics. Of the five finalists, four were closely matched throughout the race, while the fifth, Australia’s Steven Bradbury, lagged far behind. Fortunes changed quickly when the leading four crashed just before the finish line, allowing Bradbury to easily skate past them and win the gold medal. (To “Do a Bradbury” now colloquially means: “To triumph unexpectedly in a sporting event, especially due to luck or the misfortune of others.”)

Bradbury was entitled to the gold medal because he was the first across the finish line, but “surely many viewers raised immediate doubts that Bradbury was the most deserving athlete” (8). Kinghorn thinks this intuition would persist even if we were reassured that the outcome didn’t harm any of the competitors, since conceivably, it might be bad for someone to win first place: “We still feel as though something is amiss” (8). Kinghorn thinks that this is evidence that desert considerations don’t straightforwardly reduce to other normative considerations (though the view he eventually lands on is reductive). I have difficulty visualizing a case in which losing in this manner isn’t bad, so I don’t share Kinghorn’s intuition on this stronger point. 

The comment thread on a YouTube video of the race, which has millions of views, is full of comments supportive of Bradbury. Some assert that he deserved his medal. The defensive tone of some of these comments, however, suggests that many people agree, or partly agree, with Kinghorn. He might have helped himself by considering an exaggerated version of this case. Imagine that a donor to an athletic association wins a lottery to be an honorary competitor in a world championship race. During the race, all of the real athletes get injured, so the donor walks to the finish line to claim the world champion prize without breaking a sweat. Clearly, the title would be undeserved.

In Chapter 2, Kinghorn considers the contributions that earlier philosophers, particularly Adam Smith and Henry Sidgwick, have made to the development of the philosophy of desert. Smith’s account focuses on the emotions of gratitude and resentment. Actions that elicit gratitude, or provoke resentment, from “all reasonable men” deserve these responses. Sidgwick, whom Adams influenced, was more realistically inclined. He thought that truths about desert must be grounded in objective moral facts that are independent of human reactions.

Adams’ and Sidgwick’s work on desert influenced philosophers such as Joel Feinberg, who argued that moral virtue wasn’t the only basis of desert: hard work, artistic merit, or even physical beauty could all be desert bases depending on the context. What property or properties serve as the bases of desert is hotly disputed, but there seems to be a near-consensus about the model that the correct theory of desert must have. Kinghorn calls the prevailing model the “3-place model”; I think it might be better labeled the “fittingness model.” On it, all desert attributions have the following structure:

A (subject) deserves X (treatment) in virtue of Y (the desert basis)

The 3-place model could be understood in a deontic or an axiological (“telic”) way (or both). On the deontic reading, we ought to proportion our treatment of subjects according to the appropriate desert bases. On the axiological (“telic”) reading, allocation of treatment or goods according to agents’ desert bases makes a world non-instrumentally better.

In Chapter 3, Kinghorn surveys the literature on desert bases—that in virtue of which an agent deserves some treatment—and observes that disagreements about which properties serve as desert bases seems intractable. Later in the same chapter, he introduces the notion of “sham” desert claims: attributions of desert in ordinary language that don’t express genuine desert claims, but instead express the agent’s desires (e.g., “That guy deserves a punch in the face”) or make some claim about normative considerations other than desert, such as entitlement or need (e.g., “Every child deserves a home”).

Kinghorn writes:

To my thinking, it is no more evident or intuitively obvious that value exists in the apportionment of positive treatment to virtuous behavior than in the apportionment of positive treatment to beauty or human need or any other quality we might point to in recommending positive treatment. (104)

Because philosophers understand the desert bases to include some limited range of properties, and often only a single property, such as virtue, their accounts render most desert claims in ordinary language “sham” attributions. Kinghorn doesn’t think that ordinary talk about desert is so infelicitous. In order to take ordinary language seriously, he thinks that we must consider a broader range of desert bases and abandon the 3-place model.

Chapter 4 presents three stories that are supposed to elicit intuitions that the 3-place model of desert cannot easily accommodate. The first example is supposed to show that we sometimes think important matters of desert are at stake even when neither the putative desert basis, nor the deserved treatment, have any significance. That’s supposed to be a problem for the 3-place model because it’s hard to explain in what sense there could be “proportionality” between the treatment and the desert basis if the latter is a property that has neither intrinsic nor instrumental value. Kinghorn asks us to

suppose that Miranda is entered in a contest at a summer camp for teenagers. Her camp counselor has devised the contest as a way to foster group camaraderie. The contest is announced as a “quest to find the crookedest toes” among the campers. The winner of the crooked toes contest will be given a $5 gift certificate, and all the campers are eager to enter.

Miranda’s friends think she has a great shot at the prize, having seen her barefooted on previous occasions. Miranda is a finalist in the contest. But, alas, the prize is given to someone else by the camp counselor. Miranda’s friends are stunned when the winner is announced, and they are loud in voicing their complaints. Cries of “The contest was rigged!” and “We demand a recount!” echo around the room. Aside from these comic expressions, the friends do have an earnest objection. They insist, in all seriousness, that “Miranda deserved to win!” (110)

We’re apparently supposed to have the intuition that something important is at stake here: “The puzzle remains as to why Miranda’s friends feel the strong need for redress” (116). Later, we’re presented with a modified version of the case in which the award is a napkin on which the camp counselor has drawn a picture of Godzilla with a black marker and declared it to be worth “a gazillion bucks.” Again, we’re supposed to have the intuition that the outcome of the crooked toe contest matters, or at least empathize with those who do: “We might suppose that the napkin has some very minimal value to the campers in terms of bragging rights. Plausibly, though, this very minimal value does not explain the continued urgency of Miranda’s friends that ‘Miranda deserved to win!’” (116). Kinghorn’s answer is that it objectionably makes them a part of a false narrative (135–6). 

Kinghorn discusses this example many times (110–118, 135–6, 142, 147, 168, 181, 187–8). I find it very unconvincing: A crooked toe contest for a fake gazillion dollar bill is a paradigm case of something whose outcome doesn’t matter! Kinghorn’s presentation is also odd. The story, so far as we’re told, is fictional, yet Kinghorn writes as if Miranda’s friends were real and that the correct theory of desert must accommodate their reactions, e.g., “Where is the source of this value they associate with Miranda receiving what they believe she deserves?” (117); “So what would be so valuable to others about Miranda getting the prize, if they [Miranda’s friends] judge her to be the most deserving?” (118). If a real group of girls did have this reaction, I’d assume that they were playing along with a joke, not hitting upon some insight about the nature of desert.

A second story is more helpful to Kinghorn. Lars, a Danish student in the U.S., rescues a child that has fallen through ice in a pond in the town where he lives. There’s a rumor that Mayor Mel will honor Lars by giving him the “keys to the city” for a day. Lars’s parents fly out to see a ceremony in his honor, but when they ask Mel whether Lars will be given the keys to the city, she sheepishly tells them that the rumor is false; that honor is reserved for astronauts, war heroes, and the like. Lars in principle deserves this honor, Mel concedes, but if she gave it to him, she’d have to honor every fireman and police officer in the same way to be consistent, which would cheapen the symbolism. The moral that Kinghorn wants us to draw is that there can be a sense in which one treatment can be simultaneously deserved and not deserved. It’s again difficult to see what, on the 3-place model, could explain this.

Finally, there’s the story of Conway the Conman, who courts and marries Aunt Gertrude, then absconds with all her money. It turns out that he’s a serial swindler of wealthy widows. Eventually, Conway is found out. A family member of a would-be victim beats Conway up, he’s forced to return his ill-gotten gains, and he’s slapped with a lengthy jail sentence. This treatment seems roughly proportionate to Conway’s crimes, but Kinghorn thinks that we might have a “nagging feeling” Conway doesn’t quite get what he fully deserves if things play out like this. Gertrude’s family would find it more satisfying if they were able to implement the punishment themselves, and for Conway to know that they were the ones implementing it.

This is how revenge is often portrayed in movies, Kinghorn observes. Revenge movie tropes seem like an unpromising source of ethical intuitions to me. It can be entertaining to see films that draw on our retributive impulses, but these are often not very edifying. Kinghorn, however, sees a grain of insight here: “If our offenders must watch us administer their punishments, then we are assured that our offenders are being confronted with the story of their past actions toward us” (131). This happened when the victims of sexual predator Larry Nasser read statements about their experiences during his trial. “In short, the specific concern particular to desert seems importantly connected to the quest for truth” (131).

After all of this stage-setting, Kinghorn finally introduces his alternative to the 3-place model of desert in Chapter 5 and elaborates the details of his account in Chapters 6–8. Kinghorn calls his own account the “expanded model,” but I think it would be more conveniently labeled the “truth model” of desert:

The truth about A possessing Y should be acknowledged by A receiving X. (136)

As advertised, Kinghorn’s expanded model allows for a wide range of desert attributions to count as genuine, i.e., not “sham.” Y can refer to any feature, including a morally neutral one such as having crooked toes. A can refer to things as well as to agents. A landscape, on Kinghorn’s view can deserve to be made into a national park; a work of art might deserve appreciation. Those claims would be extremely implausible if Kinghorn thought that giving things what they deserve is a matter of final value, but he doesn’t think this. He describes his account as “reductive” in the sense that desert-related reasons reduce to other kinds of normative considerations.

Desert matters because truth matters, and correct desert attributions convey truth. Often, they convey truths that we need in order to “relate to one another with a mutual, accurate, deepening understanding of our respective characters and dispositions and interests and priorities” (217). Kinghorn thinks that truth is only instrumentally valuable, although his account of desert is compatible with thinking that some true beliefs have final value.

Since desert derives its significance from truth, Kinghorn seems committed to saying that desert attributions that convey trivial truths don’t matter very much. That makes his reaction to the Miranda case all the more puzzling: It would be consistent with his account if he said that since the truth about whose toes are most crooked doesn’t matter, the desert attribution in this case doesn’t matter.

This account does a better job of accommodating Kinghorn’s intuitions about other cases. It explains Kinghorn’s reaction to Bradbury’s win because an Olympic gold medal is supposed to recognize an athlete for a superior performance of a kind Bradbury (arguably) didn’t deliver. It also neatly explains Mel’s ambivalence about recognizing Lars’ good deed by giving him the keys to the city for a day. On the one hand, that recognition would highlight something true: the fact that Lars’ actions were admirable. On the other hand, by lumping Lars together with the town’s greatest heroes, Mel would be overstating the merit of Lars’ action. That’s why honoring Lars by giving him the keys to the city for a day seems in one sense apt, but in another sense inapt.

One worry I have about this account—which, in fairness, Kinghorn does anticipate—is that there are plenty of cases in which, apparently, giving someone what he deserves doesn’t have much to do with recognizing truths. For instance, if God punishes evildoers and rewards the righteous in an afterlife, it seems as though He could be giving them what they deserve, even if no one other than God knows that they’re getting their just deserts. Kinghorn’s response is that widely known punishments, administered and implemented by victims, are even more richly deserved. My intuitions again clash with Kinghorn’s on this point.

This book provides a good overview of the desert literature, and it’s enlivened by the variety of quirky stories that Kinghorn uses to test our intuitions. The theory Kinghorn develops is interesting because it departs from so much conventional wisdom about desert. The main issue I have with the book is that I don’t share a lot of Kinghorn’s intuitions, and I suspect many other readers won’t either. It’s debatable whether, and to what extent, that constitutes a flaw in this or any book. All said, philosophers interested in desert will likely find it a worthwhile read.