The Nature of Moral Responsibility: New Essays

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Randolph Clarke, Michael McKenna, and Angela M. Smith (eds.), The Nature of Moral Responsibility: New Essays, Oxford University Press, 2015, 306pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199998074.

Reviewed by Benjamin Mitchell-Yellin, Sam Houston State University


Philosophical debate about moral responsibility is as lively now as ever. This volume not only reflects contemporary interest in the subject, but also provides a sense of which aspects need development. The editors "have elected to set aside metaphysical questions about the contested compatibility of free will, moral responsibility, and determinism" in favor of contributions focused on "the nature of responsibility itself -- what it is, what form or forms it can take, and its relation to our complex practices of holding responsible" (14).

This accords with my own sense of things. Judging from citations, my thinking about moral responsibility is shaped by many of the same figures as the thinking of most (if not all) of the contributors to this volume. I, too, am a fan of P. F. Strawson's "Freedom and Resentment" and the work of Gary Watson, R. Jay Wallace and Stephen Darwall. Nevertheless, I'm struck by this volume's dissimilarity to the collections on which I cut my philosophical teeth. John Martin Fischer and Mark Ravizza's Perspectives on Moral Responsibility (1993) and Watson's Free Will (2003) include contributions on libertarianism, alternative possibilities and agent-causation. To be sure, these earlier collections also include Strawson's essay, as well as chapters on the themes central to this volume. But these common themes are placed in a different context there than they are here. This is not a criticism or complaint. But it seems noteworthy.

Indeed, it seems to be a sign of the times. The Nature of Moral Responsibility may be seen as a sequel, of sorts, to Blame: Its Nature and Norms, edited by D. Justin Coates and Neal A. Tognazzini and also published by Oxford University Press (2013). Six contributors to and two editors of the present volume also contributed chapters to that one. This is not to suggest that the present volume is redundant. Hardly. There are new voices here, and the old voices find new and interesting things to say. The point of making the comparison is not to disparage the newer collection or insinuate that it lacks significance. Rather, it seems remarkable that there are two volumes, published by the same press two years apart, both focused, largely, on the question of what to make of our evident moral responsibility. There is a lot to say on the subject. I hasten to add that much of what is said in this volume is very insightful.

Those working in areas related to moral responsibility will have much to learn from this collection. This is true for specialists in the field, as well as graduate students getting their feet wet. As I've been suggesting, the game is not quite what it once was. It would be going too far to say that the metaphysics of free will is off the beaten path. That is certainly not true. There is a great deal of interesting contemporary work being done on what are now referred to as "traditional" questions about free will (and several contributors to this volume note connections with these questions). But the action within the confines of a, roughly, Strawsonian framework is evident from volumes like this one. It's not so clear what to make of our commitment to our own responsibility.

This volume consists of twelve chapters, preceded by an introductory overview by the editors. Four of these chapters make a point of connecting their discussion to the traditional debate. T. M. Scanlon expands on what he has said about two forms of responsibility: responsibility as attributability, which he now calls "moral reaction responsibility," and substantive responsibility. He argues that moral reaction responsibility is thoroughly compatibilist. The question is not whether the agent had control over her action. Rather, there is a descriptive question: What are the relevant reactions to others' conduct? And a normative one: Are these reactions justified? Scanlon's account may be challenged in response to his answer to either question. His list of reactive attitudes is taken by some (e.g., Wallace 2011) to be too tame. It does not essentially include harsh sentiments, such as resentment and indignation. Scanlon has defended this aspect of his view elsewhere (2008, 2013) and focuses here on defending his answer to the normative question. He argues that our reactive attitudes are justified by the agent's normative attitudes in general. He engages with the work of Harry Frankfurt in arguing that the role of control over one's action is limited to whether there is reason to think that the action failed to reflect one's attitudes. And he engages with the work of Fischer (sometimes together with Tognazzini) in arguing that there is no need for a tracing condition. He also argues that his relationship-based account of blame is explanatorily superior to other conceptions.

In the final section, Scanlon discusses substantive responsibility and draws out some differences between it and moral reaction responsibility. The defense of a Rawlsian conception of the value of choice against a Nozickian conception is quite interesting. But overall, this part of the chapter is much shorter. Happily, the chapter by Rahul Kumar constitutes an extended discussion and defense of Scanlon's distinction between responsibility as attributability (moral reaction responsibility) and substantive responsibility. Kumar argues that both forms of responsibility are rooted in the contractualist ideal of living together according to principles that no one could reasonably reject. But judgments about responsibility as attributability are personal, while judgments about substantive responsibility are impersonal. He follows this with an illuminating discussion of the value of choice and the role of generic standpoints in the latter judgments. Kumar's discussion of specific cases and objections in the literature is rich and rewarding. Though each stands on its own, the chapters by Scanlon and Kumar make a fine pair.

Two other contributors explicitly reference traditional debates about free will, though they do not engage with them as extensively as Scanlon does. Gideon Rosen lays out a substantive view of moral responsibility, the Alethic conception, and develops some of its most important implications. An "Alethic view" centers on the claim that the reactive emotions are appropriate when their "ingredient thoughts" are true. Rosen's particular Alethic conception goes on to identify the relevant reactive emotions as punitive and so, given some intuitions about cases, such as those involving young children and impaired adults, commits him to the claim that resentment is appropriate just in case the target deserves it. Rosen points out that his conception may not be friendly to the compatibilist, but the general Alethic view may be.

Nomy Arpaly revisits her (2002, 2003) account of the praiseworthiness of inverse akratics, such as Huck Finn, who do right but think they are doing wrong. She considers its relevance to two common claims: (i) that it is praiseworthy to care about morality de dicto ("moral fetishism") and (ii) that knowing that one's action is wrong is required for blameworthiness. Her argument against these claims turns on establishing that the Huck Finn case tells against a more controversial claim: (iii) that moral ignorance and ordinary ignorance have the same effect on praise- and blameworthiness. Arpaly's analysis is careful and provocative. She discusses many interesting cases and draws from the contemporary literature in insightful ways. Her explicit invocation of the traditional free will debate, at the very end of her chapter, is, perhaps, telling. She, in effect, saddles her opponent -- who would defend (iii) -- with having to make recourse to the vexed questions that have been intentionally put to one side in this volume.

This strikes me as correct. It also strikes me as a welcome throwing down of the gauntlet. Those of us interested in responsibility would, I suspect, benefit from a volume that brought contemporary philosophers working on the metaphysics of free will in dialogue with those working on the issues represented in this volume. Perhaps Oxford University Press could aim for a trilogy, with a third installment along these lines. (One can hope!)

I mentioned that this volume would be beneficial for both specialists and those familiarizing themselves with the current state of the debate. One reason for this is that several of the chapters expand on recent monographs. These chapters are profitable whether or not one is already familiar with the previous works.

David Shoemaker's contribution focuses on themes from the first chapter of his Responsibility from the Margins (2015). He provides a nice overview of the debate about the "deep self" and defends an "ecumenical" account, according to which the agent's deep self is constituted by her evaluative commitments (the Platonic account) and cares (the Humean account). On Shoemaker's ecumenical account, an action is attributable to one as expressing one's agential character just in case it issues from either one's values or cares. Shoemaker argues, by appeal to instructive cases and in response to interesting objections, that neither the Platonic nor Humean view is acceptable on its own. Thus, he concludes, we should unite them.

Though Shoemaker's contribution focuses squarely on attributability, his monograph and several recent papers defend the claim that there are three distinct kinds of responsibility: attributability, answerability and accountability. In doing so, he expands on Watson's (1996) distinction between attributability and accountability and sets himself against monists, such as Angela Smith and Scanlon. This is noteworthy because questions about how many and which kinds of responsibility there are constitute a recurring theme in the present volume.

Derk Pereboom is one contributor who takes up this theme; his is also the fourth chapter to explicitly reference the traditional free will debate. His contribution follows up the sixth chapter of his Free Will, Agency, and Meaning in Life (2014). He proposes a notion of moral responsibility that does not involve desert and, thus, is not threatened by causal determination. On this view, moral responsibility is forward-looking, aiming at future protection, reconciliation and moral formation. Pereboom argues that these aims can justify familiar blaming practices -- ones in the category of answerability. Moreover, he contends that painful responses to one's own wrongdoing may be shown appropriate without appealing to desert. Along the way, he engages with several important figures in the contemporary literature and responds to objections that the notions of moral obligation and moral wrongness are undermined by causal determination. This chapter constitutes a nice contribution to Pereboom's ongoing skeptical assault on the moral responsibility status quo.

The third chapter to engage with a recent monograph is George Sher's excellent critical discussion of Michael McKenna's conversational theory as laid out in Conversation and Responsibility (2012). Sher pays special attention to McKenna's claim that neither being responsible nor holding responsible has metaphysical priority and presses the question why we should abandon the intuitive view that being responsible is prior. Key to McKenna's theory is the claim that we can analyze our responsibility practices in terms of three stages: contribution, address and account. The crux of Sher's challenge is the claim that the conventions governing holding responsible need not be taken to extend beyond a single stage; pace McKenna, one can be morally responsible for an action without understanding which reactions would be appropriate in response to one's conduct. Sher concludes by considering how his own (2006) account, on which blame is analyzed in terms of a belief that an agent acted wrongly and a desire that he hadn't done so, is capable of grounding the interesting claims McKenna makes about the conversational features of responsibility in a more satisfactory manner than the no-priority view can.

Sher's succinct contribution is a model of serious, critical engagement with another's view from the perspective of one's own. Several other chapters aim at something similar. Michael J. Zimmerman notes that the contemporary literature on moral responsibility risks confusion, and he aims to "provide a recipe for cleaning up this mess" (45). Focusing, in a Strawsonian vein, on quality of will accounts, Zimmerman lays out a procedure for comparing different kinds of responsibility in three steps: compare the objects of the respective responsibility ascriptions, the associated reactions and the fit between objects and reactions. Zimmerman's discussion of similarities between "fitting-response" accounts of value and "fitting-response" accounts of responsibility is the high point of the chapter. The appendix seems intended to set the record straight regarding the proper place of Zimmerman's own early work (1988) in the historical development of the notions of attributability, accountability and answerability.

Coleen Macnamara defends the "argument from communication" against several criticisms by Matthew Talbert and Angela Smith. The argument contends that appropriate subjects of blame must be capable of engaging in the essentially communicative practice of responsibility by taking up the reactive attitudes, in the form of feeling guilt and making amends. This, in turn, requires moral competence -- the ability to "appreciate the force and significance" of moral reasons (211). Macnamara's defense appeals to the etiology of the reactive attitudes, as well as to claims by Watson (1996) and Darwall (2006) regarding the essentially relational nature of responsibility and the conceptual grounds for the appropriateness of blame. This chapter follows up Macnamara's previous work and contributes nicely to the ongoing debate about the responsibility of the psychopath, the paradigmatic morally incompetent agent.

Julia Driver also considers the case of the psychopath and interestingly expands on earlier work. She argues for the claim, which she traces to Hume, that moral appraisability can come apart from moral agency. The discussion of Hume in establishing the distinction between moral agency, which requires meta-cognitive skills, and the possession of moral virtue/vice, which requires only self-directed behavior, is illuminating. Driver also engages with the aforementioned distinction between different kinds of responsibility. She concludes that the psychopath is morally appraisable and the appropriate subject of blame in virtue of violating the standards governing his relationships with others. But he is not a moral agent because he is incapable of appreciating moral reasons, nor morally responsible in any significant sense stronger than appraisability.

Holly M. Smith focuses on a distinction from "dual-process theory" in psychology, between System 1 (automatic, non-voluntary) and System 2 (deliberate, effortful) responses. She argues that agents are not blameworthy for actions resulting from System 1 processes. Along the way, she draws on previously published work to develop and refine a complex quality of will account of blameworthiness. She concludes that pure System 1 responses do not issue in blameworthy conduct because they fail to reflect a "sufficiently complete" set of motivational factors.

Finally, the first chapter, by Tognazzini, investigates "what it is actually like to be involved in ordinary interpersonal relationships" (21) through careful examination of passages from three works of fiction -- King Lear, Persuasion and The End of the Affair. This yields brief reflections on some of the central themes of the volume as a whole: attributability, answerability, accountability, reactive attitudes, communication. But Tognazzini studiously avoids theory as much as possible. It may not be too much of a stretch to see the chapters that follow his as something of a working out of the Strawsonian groundwork Tognazzini lays. Indeed, the first sentence of his chapter is a remarkably apt beginning for this collection. Tognazzini notes that for Strawson "the center of the moral responsibility universe is not freedom, or the ability to do otherwise, or the utility of punishment, but 'our natural human commitment to ordinary interpersonal attitudes'" (19).


Arpaly, Nomy. 2002. "Moral Worth." Journal of Philosophy 99, 223-245.

Arpaly, Nomy. 2003. Unprincipled Virtue. Oxford University Press.

Coates, D. Justin, and Neal A. Tognazzini, eds. 2013. Blame: Its Nature and Norms. Oxford University Press.

Darwall, Stephen. 2006. The Second-Person Standpoint: Morality, Respect, and Accountability. Harvard University Press.

Fischer, John Martin and Mark Ravizza, eds. 1993. Perspectives on Moral Responsibility. Cornell University Press.

McKenna, Michael. 2012. Conversation and Responsibility. Oxford University Press.

Pereboom, Derk. 2014. Free Will, Agency, and Meaning in Life. Oxford University Press.

Scanlon, T. M. 2008. Moral Dimensions: Permissibility, Meaning, and Blame. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Scanlon, T. M. 2013. "Interpreting Blame." In Blame: Its Nature and Norms, eds. D. Justin Coates and Neal A. Tognazzini, 84-99. Oxford University Press.

Sher, George. 2006. In Praise of Blame. Oxford University Press.

Shoemaker, David. 2015. Responsibility from the Margins. Oxford University Press.

Strawson, P. F. 1962. "Freedom and Resentment." Proceedings of the British Academy 48: 187-211.

Wallace, R. Jay. "Dispassionate Opprobrium: On Blame and the Reactive Sentiments." In Reasons and Recognition: Essays on the Philosophy of T. M. Scanlon, eds. R. J. Wallace, S. Freeman, and R. Kumar, 348-372. Oxford University Press.

Watson, Gary. 1996. "Two Faces of Responsibility." Philosophical Topics 24, no. 2: 227-248.

Watson, Gary, ed.. 2003. Free Will, 2nd edition. Oxford University Press.

Zimmerman, Michael J. 1988. An Essay on Moral Responsibility. Rowman and Littlefield.