The Nature of Normativity

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Ralph Wedgwood, The Nature of Normativity, Oxford University Press, 2007, 296pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199251315.

Reviewed by Mark Shroeder, University of Southern California


After a long dearth of respectability, non-reductive, intuitionist metaethical theories are in resurgence, now finding defenders in nearly every corner.  With a gorgeous purple jacket design that is explicitly evocative of the form of the good shining down from the heavens above, The Nature of Normativity's unabashed Platonism is apt to sound initially like more of the same.  But nothing could be further from the truth; the explanatory power, breadth, and sheer inventiveness of Ralph Wedgwood's work places him in a category of his own.

The standard formula for exponents of both contemporary and historical non-reductive intuitionism is mostly negative -- other views are argued to be false or problematic, or to be inconsistent with a fully engaged moral commitment, and then relatively little is said about the questions in metaphysics, the philosophies of mind and language, and epistemology, that alternative metaethical theories are really designed to answer: including answering how and why the normative supervenes on the non-normative, how our words and thoughts manage to be about the normative, and how we ever manage to find out about it.  Or when positive things are said, they resort to old formulas.  In contrast, this fascinating, deeply creative, and widely ranging volume is entirely about answering these important inter-sub-disciplinary (in his apt words) questions (one major section is devoted to each).  It is a first-rate contribution not only to metaethics, but to metaphysics, the philosophies of mind and language, and epistemology, and it demands careful study from anyone with a serious interest in any of these areas.

If the book has a flaw (and it does), it is that it is so wide-ranging and so fast-moving.  Wedgwood seems at times to feel an obligation to say something about everything, and, with a few exceptions, he very nearly does.  But the cost is that many of the important pieces of his positive view are sketched only in a way that -- though surely clearly worked out in his own head -- are less than fully developed on the page.  For example, it is part of Wedgwood's fast-moving discussion that he often introduces complications which require modifications of his earlier discussion without comment, as if to presuppose that no modification is necessary, or that it is obvious how to go about modifying the earlier view.  But the result is distracting and makes much of the book difficult to absorb, and in some cases manifests outright problems with his positive view.

A pertinent and early example is his treatment of the thesis of Normative Judgment Internalism (NJI, for short), which Wedgwood understands as the thesis that necessarily, someone who is rational and judges, 'I ought to φ' will also intend to φ.  In chapters 1 through 3, Wedgwood argues for and defends NJI, and argues that the problem with competing truth-conditional approaches to semantics is that they do not explain the truth of NJI.  Yet when we get to chapter 4 and Wedgwood's own positive view, not only does he never explain how his own view does manage to accommodate NJI, in excusing himself from doing so, he actually provides what is by his own lights a counterexample to NJI.

The counterexample is the important kind of case that my colleague Jake Ross calls the 'three-envelope problem', and arises whenever you have three options, know which one is second-best, and know that it is closer to the best option than to the worst, but don't know which option is best or which is worst.  In such a case, Wedgwood himself notes, you may know that you ought to do either A or B, but since you don't know which, it is perfectly rational for you to intend to do C, which splits the difference, and hence rational to not intend to do either A or B.  So much for Normative Judgment Internalism, even by Wedgwood's own lights.

In place of a rational connection between first-personal normative judgments and intentions, Wedgwood goes on to explain a rational connection between first-personal normative judgments and 'ideal plans', which aren't exactly plans.  Your ideal plan, apparently, is the plan that you would act on if you were subject to no ignorance or uncertainty.  Of course, since we are always subject to some ignorance or uncertainty, we may never actually act on our ideal plans, which makes it far from clear why or whether we actually always have such things as part of our mental economy, or why it would be irrational not to form one which entails doing what you think you ought.  They are certainly a further cry from explaining first-personal Normative Judgment Internalism than came advertised.

What is problematic about this discussion is not so much that Wedgwood is providing his own counterexample to the very principle that he appealed to in order to motivate his own view and on the grounds of which he dismissed its main competitors, but that he appears not even to notice.  With care, it is possible to reconstruct his earlier discussion so that the feature of normative judgments that he does explain -- their connection to ideal plans -- is what is used to motivate his view and to dismiss its competitors (though once the nature of ideal plans is spelled out, the resulting thesis certainly lacks the intuitive allure of NJI at a first pass), but Wedgwood himself gives us no guidance in doing so, and it is natural to find the result frustrating.  It's his view, after all; we shouldn't need to do so much work in order to find out what it says.  It's reasonable to expect him to do the work for us.

It's also unclear, even assuming that NJI is true, why it is a problem for competing truth-conditional semantic approaches, that they do not themselves explain the truth of NJI.  It is central to the appeal of Wedgwood's approach throughout the book that things -- particularly metaphysical necessities -- stand in need of substantive explanation rather than quietist putting-off.  So I can well agree with him that if NJI is true, then it certainly needs to be explained.  But Wedgwood's demand that it be explained by a semantic theory is hard to understand.  On the face of it, by Wedgwood's own criteria, a necessity that involves rationality, intention, and beliefs about what one ought to do, could be explained by essential features of rationality or intention, rather than by essential features of the concept 'ought'.  This observation is particularly pertinent, given that there is a well-established group of theories which appeal to features of rationality in order to explain why it is irrational not to intend what you believe you ought to do.  By Wedgwood's own criteria, this should be a perfectly coherent possibility.

But in any case, as Christine Korsgaard has aptly noted, philosophers are often not at their best when they are criticizing the views of others, and it is not for his criticisms of others -- whether competing truth-conditional semantic approaches (just discussed), reductivism (he borrows an argument from George Bealer), or expressivism (don't get me started) -- that you must read this book.  It is for its resourceful and imaginative take on the explanatory challenges facing non-reductive metaethical theories that this book deserves your careful attention and study.  Though he covers far more territory than I could possibly hope to discuss in this review, here is a whirlwind tour of its main highlights.

The book is divided into three parts, its first part focusing on the semantics of normative language and moral thought, the second on normative metaphysics, and the third on normative epistemology.  All three parts are tied together by Wedgwood's version of the idea that the intentional is normative -- both the attitude of belief in general and the conceptual roles of particular concepts are individuated by features of what makes them rational or correct, and this idea drives many of his arguments throughout the book.  In what follows, I'll survey his account of normative semantics and give a brief picture of his normative metaphysics, but won't be able to get to the section on epistemology.

After his negative arguments, the first part of the book is consumed with the project of developing a full-scale theory of how words and thoughts come to refer, applying that theory to normative concepts, and trying to show that it yields a plausible and defensible theory of the referent of the concept, 'ought'.  It is an ambitious project, worthy of a book in its own right, but it fits into chapters 4 and 5, loose ends and all.  Actually, in a typical example of the way that he makes things more complicated without going back to clear up how the complication is to be sorted out, he only gives a conceptual-role semantics for a special case of 'ought' -- though tells us that 'ought' expresses a variety of concepts in a context-dependent way, and later gives us hints of what he would say about those other concepts and predictions about how they are related.  He never goes back and generalizes his previous account.

The two main attractions of Wedgwood's conceptual-role semantics are how it is designed specifically to explain Normative Judgment Internalism (or at least, the weaker claim about 'ideal plans' which he substitutes, instead), and how it allows us to explain how normative terms and thoughts could pick out properties that are sui generis and irreducible.  But the biggest problems in the neighborhood derive from the fact that it is insufficiently spelled out for us to test it in a general way -- a problem that is illustrated acutely by Wedgwood's introduction of a conceptual-role semantics for 'permissible'.

In general, Wedgwood's conceptual role theory of content-determination (which he calls a 'conceptual role semantics') associates each concept with a conceptual role, which is essentially a rule that says that someone who has a certain kind of belief involving that concept is rationally committed to making certain kinds of inferences -- usually to other beliefs, but sometimes to other kinds of mental states, prominently including kinds of planning.  Rational commitment is a requiring notion -- it is because of the conceptual role of '&' that someone who believes 'P&Q' is rationally required to believe 'P' and to believe 'Q'.  The theory -- which can almost be read off of Wedgwood's later claims about the essence of belief -- says that each concept refers to whatever property is the weakest property that would make out to be valid each rationally committing inference that is part of the concept's conceptual role, in the sense that if it is correct to be in the first state, then it is uniquely correct to be in the second state.

So for '&', the idea is simple -- since a belief is correct only if true, '&' must have the weakest reference that would make the beliefs 'P' and 'Q' true whenever 'P&Q' is true.  And as it turns out, conjunction is the weakest possible referent satisfying this constraint.  Other referents for '&' could make 'P' and 'Q' true whenever 'P&Q' is, but they would make 'P&Q' stronger.  That, anyway, is the basic idea, and how it works for the simplest possible test case.

So far, so good.  The conceptual roles that Wedgwood introduces for '&', 'not', and 'ought' all involve conceptual roles that are obligatory -- ones that involve rational commitment in a requiring sense.  So his theory is developed from these cases, and it delivers verdicts in them.  But when Wedgwood gets to 'permissible', he is forced, in order to get things right, to introduce a conceptual role that involves a permissive, rather than an obligating, rational relationship.  Though Wedgwood fudges in the text and assigns a semantic value nevertheless, his original theory didn't even apply to such cases -- it only told us what referent gets assigned to a conceptual role, based on the rationally obligatory inferences that it requires.  It didn't tell us what to do with a conceptual role that is merely permissive.

It's not that I don't think this problem can be fixed; what I think is that it demonstrates how much more work is involved in actually spelling out a genuine conceptual role theory of content determination than Wedgwood really acknowledges.  And consequently, it shows just how far Wedgwood is from having spelled out a real theory, rather than just a sketch of what one might look like.  A real theory should make predictions about new cases, rather than needing to be adjusted along the way, as Wedgwood's is for each and every case that he considers, from 'not' to 'ought' to 'permissible'.  Finally, the problem, of course, is much more general; though Wedgwood purports to be offering a general theory, he doesn't really tell us enough in order for it to be clear how it will work for ordinary descriptive predicates, or generalize to names.

Ordinarily, when a philosopher claims to explain things by appeal to normative features of some mental state -- such as its rational properties -- and then says that this is fine because these features are constitutive of belief, or of that concept, I want to know how this solves anything.  After all, if I started by wondering why it is that Max's concept 'ought' refers to the ought relation, and what I got was an explanation in terms of what inferences are rational for Max, what I want now is an explanation of why those inferences are rational for Max, and not others -- an explanation which cannot advert, surely, to the reference of his concept, because it is part of what determines that reference.  This question takes us into the domain of metaphysics.  Wedgwood's answer to challenges like this one is provocative and challenging, and forms a core part of the book.

Just as his answer to the questions in the philosophies of mind and language was built on what at least purported to be a complete theory of content-determination, his answer to questions from metaphysics like this one is built on what at least purports to be a complete theory of modality and essence.  The answer is that there are some physical properties that Max has which determine -- by necessitating -- that his concept has certain rational properties, and hence that it is the concept 'ought'.  But Wedgwood feels no need to tell us which physical properties these are, or why they necessitate this, because since it is the essence of the normative to supervene, no matter which physical properties they turn out to be, they will necessitate this (given that it is actually true that it is the concept 'ought').  This is because though it is necessary that anyone who has these physical properties will have the concept 'ought', this is in a certain sense ultimately contingent.

If a proposition is contingent just in case it is possibly true and possibly false, we can define 'ultimately contingent' (this is my term, not Wedgwood's) as follows.  Let us say that a proposition is ultimately possible just in case it satisfies the disjunction of this infinite sequence: possible or possibly possible or possibly possibly possible or … .  Then we can say that a proposition is ultimately contingent just in case it is both ultimately possibly true and ultimately possibly false.  At the very center of Wedgwood's positive view in the book, is the idea that what is possibly possible need not be possible, and hence that many necessary truths -- like that used to connect Max's physical constitution to the question of which concept he has -- are nevertheless ultimately contingent.

This opens up what is apparently a big difference between Wedgwood and other non-reductivists who leave metaphysical necessities like this one unexplained.  For those who accept the 'S4' principle that what is possibly possible is itself possible, unexplained necessities are like brute features of the structure of possibility.  Whereas for Wedgwood, the features that we might otherwise think are brute features of the structure of possibility are instead explained by where we are in the structure of ultimate possibility, which itself has no brute features.  So in this view, necessities need no longer be brute or unexplained; they are instead explained in part by contingent truths (which, because they are contingent, can be brute and unexplained without any problem).  For those of us used to assuming that what is possibly possible is also possible, or at least who have assumed that this is close enough to true not to raise extra wrinkles in metaethics, this amounts to a big and important idea, whose consequences it is important to explore much further than I have space to do, here.  Among the questions that remain, is whether this is just a more sophisticated kind of quietism.

Due to its richness and depth, I've left the vast part of The Nature of Normativity unexplored here, barely touching on some of its intriguing highlights, and saying little about its creative treatment of normative epistemology.  Though periodically frustrating for its lack of detail, its richness and the surprising coherence of the interconnected views that it advocates demand serious attention.  No view with so many interconnected moving parts can be very likely to be true, but if any version of non-reductive intuitionism is on the right track, I would have to place my bets in Wedgwood's corner.