The Nature of Scientific Thinking: On Interpretation, Explanation, and Understanding

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Jan Faye, The Nature of Scientific Thinking: On Interpretation, Explanation, and Understanding, Palgrave Macmillan, 2014, 333pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137389824.

Reviewed by Henk W. de Regt, VU University Amsterdam


Two years ago Jan Faye published After Postmodernism: A Naturalistic Reconstruction of the Humanities (Palgrave Macmillan 2012). His new book complements that work, applying the same approach to the natural sciences. In fact, one of Faye's central theses is that (at least from the epistemological point of view) no sharp distinction between the humanities and the natural sciences can or should be drawn. In contrast to the traditional view that the natural sciences aim at explanation and representation while the humanities strive for understanding and interpretation, Faye claims that these four notions are important in all disciplines. He elaborates this thesis for the natural sciences, presenting a theory that connects explanation, interpretation, representation, and understanding.

Faye's approach is naturalistic in the sense that he analyzes the phenomenon of scientific thinking, drawing on cognitive science and evolutionary theory to explain its characteristics. His aim is "to describe how our human cognitive capacities allow scientists to acquire an understanding of nature by means of representation, interpretation, and explanation," and he endorses the view that these capacities are "a product of evolution and due to our adapting to our external environment" (vii). Faye combines his naturalistic approach with a pragmatic view of science that emphasizes the context-dependence of scientific explanation and understanding and allows for pluralism when it comes to scientific representation and interpretation. As he explains in the final chapter, there is no tension here, because naturalism and pragmatism are two sides of the same coin: scientific thinking is part of human nature, but this implies that science rests on "human perspectives, cognitive limitations, and epistemic interests" (270).

Naturalistic analyses of science such as Faye's are first and foremost geared towards describing and explaining science as a human activity, and not so much to offering a framework for normative assessment of the products of science. Indeed, Faye explicitly writes that his account of science is "thoroughly descriptive" and that he does not aspire to provide a "normative ideal for evaluating better or worse acts of explaining or instances of understanding" (ix). In this review I will give an overview of the book and assess its merits as a descriptive account of science. I will also address the question of normativity: Can Faye really do without normative appraisal?

The first two chapters address the notion of understanding, which Faye regards as the main aim of scientific explanation. Chapter 1 discusses various philosophical views of scientific understanding. Faye criticizes the traditional idea, championed by Carl Hempel, that understanding is merely a subjective feature of explanation. Subsequently, he discusses three different forms of understanding (through unification, description of causal-mechanisms, and visualization) and concludes that understanding is an important aim of science but is pluralistic and depends on contextual and pragmatic factors. In Chapter 2 Faye presents his view of the nature of understanding, defending it against its rivals, the content view and the ability view. On the content view, understanding is a type of knowledge, namely knowledge of the (explanatory) content of our beliefs. On the ability view, by contrast, understanding is the cognitive skill that is needed to construct explanations. Faye rejects both views and presents an alternative, the organization view, on which understanding consists in "grasping how pieces of information relate to one another" (59).

Understanding can be embodied or reflective. The former is non-representational and typically tacit, while the latter is representational and explicit (44-45). In line with his naturalistic approach, Faye sees continuity between human and animal cognition, arguing that some of the lower-level, embodied forms of understanding (such as experiential, imaginative and instrumental understanding) can be had by animals as well. Higher-level, reflective forms (such as explanatory, theoretical, and interpretive understanding) are distinctively human, however, and typical of scientific thinking. Faye wants to remain descriptive and emphasizes that understanding does not require knowledge: even false beliefs may lead to understanding. This view will be congenial to historically minded philosophers of science, who may want to assert, for example, that Aristotelians had explanatory understanding of motion even though we now consider many of their beliefs false.

Faye presents the following characterization of reflective understanding, which expresses his organization view in a more formal manner:

(U) A human agent A understands a state of affair, P, in a certain context, C, in the terms of a theory, T, if, and only if, A's belief regarding P connects (in the epistemically correct way for A; i.e., in accordance to A's epistemic norms, N, of understanding) with A's cognitive system, including A's background knowledge, beliefs, and assumptions (A's worldview). (54)

Above I noted that Faye presents his account of understanding as purely descriptive. It seems, however, that (U) functions as a normative criterion. To be sure, the epistemic norms mentioned in (U) are those of A, and not some absolute, universal norms; (U) merely describes these norms. But (U) expresses a demand for coherence as an overarching norm for understanding. I do not think Faye's hidden normative stance is problematic; on the contrary, a philosophical theory of understanding should be normative in some sense. The problem is rather that (U) fails to do the work that Faye wants it to do. This becomes clear when Faye denies that his view entails relativism by arguing that although, for example, creationism is coherent, the scientific worldview provides "a more accurate, detailed, and coherent worldview than the Biblical one" (53). This argument does not convince because, first, invoking the criteria of accuracy and detail appears ad hoc since these do not appear in (U), and second, coherence alone does not guarantee epistemological superiority, as I will argue below.

Chapters 3 and 4 deal, respectively, with interpretation and representation. Faye's conception of interpretation is broader than the traditional one, on which interpretation is concerned with intentions and meaning, and accordingly pertains to the social sciences and humanities only. This is, of course, not as revolutionary as it might seem at first sight, since it is quite common in the natural sciences to speak of the interpretation of data or theories. However, Faye's point is that such interpretations -- as in the human sciences -- are determined not only by the object but also by the scientists and their context. The same holds for representation, which is characterized as "an intentional activity where an agent proposes some symbolic construct to represent a phenomenon for a certain purpose" (85). In Chapter 4 Faye discusses types of representation, such as laws, theories and models, articulating his views mainly via assessment of accounts from the literature (e.g., of Nancy Cartwright and Ronald Giere). While Faye's specific arguments and examples are generally clear and often convincing, what is missing is a more systematic exposition in which his ideas about understanding, interpretation, and representation are explicitly related. For example, the section on 'representation and understanding' starts with the statement that "representation and understanding go hand in hand" (91), but after some general remarks about understanding that seem unrelated to the view developed in the previous chapters, Faye enters into a long discussion of the analysis of Talal Debs and Michael Redhead that does not mention the notion of understanding at all. Also, while the notions of interpretation and representation are clearly strongly related, there are almost no explicit links between Chapters 3 and 4.

The largest part of the book is concerned with scientific explanation. In Chapters 5-7 Faye reviews important types of explanation -- such as nomic, causal, structural, and functional explanation -- and observes that each type may have merits in a particular context (he claims that this holds even for different characterizations of causal explanation; 146). This leads him to conclude that explanation is essentially pragmatic, a thesis further elaborated and defended in Chapter 8. After having presented eight reasons for favoring a naturalistic-pragmatic approach to explanation, he discusses van Fraassen's well-known pragmatic theory and criticisms of it by Kitcher, Salmon, and Achinstein. Faye defends van Fraassen's theory against Kitcher's and Salmon's accusation that it is too liberal, but he agrees with Achinstein that it is not pragmatic enough. Accordingly, he sets out to develop an alternative pragmatic theory of explanation. The next two chapters are devoted to this project.

A common way to analyze explanations -- adopted, for example, by van Fraassen -- is by treating them as answers to questions, in particular why-questions. This approach is especially suited to developing a pragmatic account of explanation, since it allows for incorporating the conversational context in the analysis. Faye takes this route as well, but in contrast to existing accounts he broadens the notion of explanation in such a way that not only why-questions but also how-, what- and which-questions can be regarded as explanation-seeking questions.

I think, however, that when Faye suggests that questions such as "When did life begin?", "What is the chemical composition of water?" and "How far away are the quasars?" are explanation-seeking questions (218-19), he stretches the notion too far. It is true, as argued in Section 2 of Chapter 9, that the distinction between description and explanation cannot always be sharply drawn and moreover depends on the context. For example, an answer to the question "What is the chemical composition of water?" may be an explanation for someone who wonders why electrolysis of water produces the gases hydrogen and oxygen but lacks this crucial bit of information. But it isn't an explanation for someone who simply wants to know what the composition of water is (for example, because she needs this knowledge in order to pass a test). In the former case, it seems that the what-question is explanation-seeking because it is asked in a context of searching the answer to a different question, a why-question. So the what-question reduces to a why-question.

Faye denies that all explanation-seeking questions can be reduced to why-questions without distortion of meaning (231-34). I find his arguments for this claim unconvincing, however. As counterexamples he mentions questions such as "Of what stuff is the universe predominantly made?" or "How did the universe begin?". Let us have a closer look at the former question. The currently accepted answer is "dark matter," which might be further specified depending on (less unanimously accepted) views of the nature of dark matter. Faye suggests that whatever the correct answer is, "the explanation will consist of a very complex story requiring calculations based upon observations, hypotheses, conjectures and theories. Such complex answers act as genuine scientific explanations" (232). But here he has tacitly shifted the discussion to the question of why the universe is predominantly made of stuff X (in other words, to a request for justifying the given answer to the original what-question).

Retaining the idea that how- and what-questions such as the above are explanation-seeking by itself leads to a conception of explanation so general that it becomes vacuous. I agree that explanation is an important aim of science, but not every question asked by scientists is a request for explanation (Think of questions such as: "How can we experimentally split up water into its components?"). To avoid the vacuity objection while acknowledging that (depending on the context) how- and what-questions may be explanation-seeking as well, I suggest invoking the notion of understanding: a (satisfactory) answer to a question is an explanation if, and only if, it enhances the understanding of the questioner. Adopting Faye's 'organization view' of understanding, this entails that a question is explanation-seeking if it is meant to enhance the questioners' grasping of how their beliefs hang together. This harmonizes with Faye's statements that the purpose of explanation is to provide understanding (see, e.g., 224, 241, 252-53).

Faye's analysis of explanation culminates in Chapter 10, where he combines the insights gathered so far into his own 'pragmatic-rhetorical' theory of explanation. Like Achinstein, Faye starts from Austin's speech act theory, but he argues that explanation is not (as Achinstein holds) an illocutionary act, but a perlocutionary act. Explanation is "a matter of intending to change the mind of the explainee [the person receiving the explanation], or to enlighten him on a subject about which he is ignorant" (250), and therefore Lloyd Bitzer's notion of 'rhetorical situation' can be used to analyze explanatory practices (255-59). According to Faye, the pragmatic-rhetorical theory accounts for important features of explanation, such as being context-dependent and providing understanding.

The following statement epitomizes Faye's view: "From a rhetorical point of view, the persuasive force [that] an explanation gains from its ability to induce understanding successfully in the inquirer depends on the relevance and the plausibility of the response as perceived by the explanation seeker" (255). The aim of an explanation is to provide the 'explainee' with understanding, but whether it succeeds depends on contextual factors such as his cognitive background, skills, values, and epistemic interests. It is the rhetorical situation -- consisting of audience, exigencies, and constraints -- that determines whether or not particular information is explanatorily relevant. This implies that explanatory force is not determined by mere logical relations. Moreover, truth per se is not required, only the belief that the explanation is true (263). Faye states that "an explanation has explanatory force if, and only if, it can persuade the audience to regard it as true" (266).

He illustrates this with a story of an unfaithful husband who explains lipstick traces on his collar by mentioning the fact that a lady bumped against him on the bus (264-66). For the assessment of the explanatory force of the given explanation it does not matter whether either the lady on the bus or his mistress was the true cause of the lipstick traces. Even if the husband's explanation were true, it might lack persuasive force for his wife, for example, if she has other reasons for suspecting he is having an affair and accordingly does not trust him. For her the false explanation may be more persuasive: it coheres with her background knowledge, while she does not think highly of her husband's trustworthiness as an explainer. This seems a good description of the actual rhetorical force of the explanation, which fits Faye's organization view of understanding. However, my worry is that it renders explanation a too subjective and relativistic matter. Coherence and trust are admirable values, but are insufficient if everything depends on the perception of the explanation seeker. Think, for example, of conspiracy theorists: the pragmatic-rhetorical theory of explanation accommodates their way of thinking and explaining, and leaves no room for criticizing their distorted view of reality. It seems that one needs at least some norm that transcends the rhetorical situation.

In sum, The Nature of Scientific Thinking offers a wide-ranging perspective on the natural sciences. Faye presents his views in discussion with existing accounts of explanation, understanding, representation and interpretation, and illustrates his theses with many detailed examples from a variety of disciplines. Despite my critical remarks, I would recommend this book to anyone interested in science as a human enterprise.