The Nature of Time

Placeholder book cover

Ulrich Meyer, The Nature of Time, Oxford University Press, 2013, 161pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199599332.

Reviewed by Jennifer Wang, University of Georgia


The Nature of Time is a fantastic read. It provides a concise introduction to various issues in the philosophy of time and a well-presented defense of a novel view.

Meyer’s stated aim is to answer what he considers to be the central question in the philosophy of time: What sorts of things are instants of times? The answer he defends is rather surprising: times are linguistic entities. The core of Meyer’s view is tense primitivism, the view that the tense operators of tense logic are conceptually primitive. These tense operators are used to construct linguistic ersatz times, which help solve problems of expressive power for tense logic. But rather than endorsing the typical combination of tense primitivism with presentism, Meyer ends up with a version of eternalism on which all times are on a par with each other, including the present time. The result is an interesting and relatively unexplored theory of time.

Tense primitivism is a modal account of time, which treats time on analogy with modality rather than with space. Chapters 2 and 3 are devoted to examining and rejecting various spatial accounts of time. Temporal substantivalists countenance metaphysically basic times, while temporal relationists hold that temporal relations supervene on material objects or events. This is a valuable discussion for those seeking an overview of the landscape. Chapters 4 through 8 introduce and develop Meyer’s view. The remaining four chapters address questions concerning presentism, temporal passage, and relativity. My focus will be on Meyer’s positive view rather than his arguments against rival spatial accounts of time.

There are two main components to Meyer’s positive view: primitivism about tense operators and linguistic ersatzism about times. The first involves taking seriously the tense operators of tense logic. Tense logic is introduced on analogy with modal logic, which involves adding the modal operator ◊ (‘possibly’) to propositional logic, or in the case of tense logic, the operators P (‘it was the case that’) and F (‘it will be the case that’). Just as we may define the modal operator \Box (‘necessarily’) as an abbreviation of ¬◊¬, we may add the tense operators H (‘it has always been the case that’) and G (‘it will always be the case that’) as derived notions in the temporal case. Different axioms corresponding to possible features of time like denseness yield different systems of tense logic. In order to not ‘prejudge’ questions like whether the time series is dense, Meyer endorses a tense logic Z that imposes minimal structural constraints on the time series. Z adds only two axiom schemas to the theorems of propositional logic: a schema guaranteeing that ‘earlier than’ and ‘later than’ (invoked as accessibility relations between ‘times’ in the model theory) are converses, and analogues of the schemas for the weakest normal modal logic K.

An immediate worry I have is that many will find Meyer’s motivations for adopting a minimal tense logic objectionable. Meyer writes, ‘If we grant that the theorems of Z are analytic, this would also mean that our knowledge of time is analytic a priori. . . . Mine is a minimal theory of time, according to which there is very little to be known about time itself’ (47). This does not mean that time cannot have features like denseness, a transitive earlier-than relation, a beginning or end, metric structure, or branching structure. According to Meyer, such features would be features of what is ‘happening in time’ rather than part of its nature. He is thus taking a methodological stance: ‘these are empirical questions that should have no place in an investigation of the nature of time itself’ (47). The worry is that even those who agree that these features are an empirical matter may disagree with the claim that they cannot be part of the nature of time. On scientific essentialism, for instance, natural kinds have natures that are empirically discoverable. Meyer does not specify how strong a connection he takes there to be between the analytic a priori and knowledge of natures or essences generally.

One of the greatest strengths of this book is Meyer’s care in exploring the analogy between time and modality. One well-known disadvantage of tense logic is that it is expressively impoverished in comparison to extensional logics that permit quantification over times. Accordingly, Meyer ‘supplements’ his theory with a linguistic ersatz theory of times, on the model of the more familiar linguistic ersatz theories of possible worlds. A possible present is a maximal consistent set of sentences of tense logic (so it will include sentences of the form Pφ, PFφ, etc.). Given a possible present, one may (in principle) construct a time series using a method Meyer provides, which involves extracting information about other times implicitly described in the possible present. Some possible present is actual if it correctly describes how things presently are.

It is worth noting that Meyer’s view differs in important ways from linguistic ersatzism about possible worlds. In the modality debate, ersatz worlds are typically defined as maximal consistent sets of ‘non-modalized’ sentences, those that do not involve  or \Box. This does not thereby commit the ersatzer about worlds to a reductive theory of modality, but it makes it look more attractive. The analogous move in the temporal case would be to define ersatz times as maximal consistent sets of ‘non-temporalized’ sentences, those that do not involve tense operators. But as few want to reduce the temporal to the non-temporal, there is less pressure to impose this restriction. Thus, Meyer’s view of times is well-suited to the tense primitivist, who accepts primitive tense operators into her ideology anyway. Ersatz times are no additional commitment. But there is an immediate odd consequence of ersatzism about times: certain features of the time series, such as the number of times there are, depends on the expressive resources of the time-making language. Meyer seems to think that it is enough that his view ‘gives tense primitivists as many times as they could possibly want’ (69).

We can press Meyer on this point. While ersatz times for Meyer are a mere convenience, his primitive tense operators are not. What temporal facts are true of our world should not be language dependent, even if the resources we have for expressing them are. This leads to the question of what Meyer thinks primitive tense operators reflect in the world, which Meyer himself does not address. Consider the analogous view in modality, modalism, on which the modal operators are primitive. The typical modalist understands this form of primitiveness to be ideological rather than ontological. While modal operators don’t correspond to any entities in the modalist’s ontology, in endorsing a sentence ◊φ the modalist accepts that the world is such that it is primitively the case that φ is possibly true. It seems to me that Meyer should likewise say that if Fφ is true, then the world is primitively such that it will be the case that φ is true. But the problem of language dependence remains. What is primitively true about the world should not ultimately be language dependent, even if languages that are relatively impoverished may express fewer truths.

At this point, the tense primitivist might turn to propositions as the primary bearers of truths, rather than the sentences that express them. In fact, one might think that Meyer is committed to the existence of temporal propositions: propositions that may change in truth value over time. After all, someone who endorses eternalist propositions, which do not change in truth value over time, would have no use for primitive tense operators. But in chapter 5, Meyer argues that the tense primitivist is not committed to either view of the nature of propositions, and may in fact accept both kinds, because ‘abstract objects do not take up any space’ (50). He sidesteps the question of what temporal facts there are by rejecting a common motivation for positing them: the truthmaker principle. And Meyer explicitly rejects an alternative to his view that constructs times using maximal propositions, preferring the ‘ontological frugality of tense primitivism’ (66). In short, he is not very keen on propositions.

The remainder of this discussion will be devoted to implications for past and future objects. As noted, Meyer accepts a version of eternalism, as all ersatz times are on a par. But there is another claim often associated with eternalism: all past, present, and future objects are on a par as well. Indeed, in introducing the landscape of views, Meyer writes: ‘Presentism claims that only present objects exist; the growing block view holds that only the past and present are real, but not the future; and eternalism contends that all times are metaphysically on the same footing.’ (87) In addition to talk of times being on a par, two distinct notions are invoked here: the reality of times and the existence of objects. Elsewhere, Meyer seems reluctant to adopt talk of what’s ‘metaphysically real’ (see 64). However, it seems fair to press him on the ontological status of past and future objects. We thus have two non-equivalent characterizations of eternalism:

(1) Past, present, and future times are on a par.

(2) Past, present, and future times are on a par, and past, present, and future objects are on a par

The worry is this: while Meyer explicitly defines all times as linguistic entities, he does not take a stance on what past and future objects are. In the modal debate, ersatzers typically introduce ersatz individuals alongside ersatz worlds. If ersatz worlds are maximal consistent sets of sentences, then ersatz individuals are the corresponding sets of open formulas. A tense primitivist could define ersatz past and future objects in a similar fashion, by identifying them with the sets of open formulas corresponding to possible presents. But surely no one wants to identify present objects with sets of open formulas as well. Or at the very least, one who stipulatively defines ‘present object’ in this way may also acknowledge the present existence of non-linguistic objects. Given (1), such a tense primitivist is an eternalist, but given an appropriate interpretation of (2), she is not.

What exactly does Meyer think about past and future objects? Part of the answer may lie in chapter 8, which concerns the interaction of tense operators with quantifiers and identity. Meyer adopts the ‘untensed’ reading of the existential quantifier, which he understands to mean that ‘the range of quantification always comprises all objects that exist at some time or other’ (81). To make claims about existence at a particular time, he adds a primitive existence predicate E!. Meyer then endorses a tense analogue of the simplest quantified modal logic, which involves a single, or constant, domain of objects rather than domains for each ‘time’ in the model theory. The work of pairing objects with ‘times’ is done by E!. Constant domain model theory meshes well with Meyer’s choice of the minimal tense logic Z (or rather, its combination with predicate logic) as the underlying logic of the tense operators, since generating soundness and completeness proofs is straightforward, as in the modal case.

The upshot is that past objects like Julius Caesar are included in the domain of quantification, but not in the interpretation of E! at each time. Or at least, this is the case if there is an intended model. Elsewhere, Meyer writes:

If we are lucky, and if the sentences in [present time] p are in fact true, then we might also get an intended model in which constants name material objects and in which predicates pick out genuine properties, but logic alone cannot tell us whether there is such a ‘concrete’ model. (86)

While I am sympathetic to this attitude, I don’t think Meyer can remain noncommittal. Meyer’s view appears to require interpreted sentences in the construction of ersatz times -- after all, there couldn’t be an actual present time (as he suggests there is) if the sentences correctly describing how things presently are remain uninterpreted.

It is not entirely clear what this means for the resulting ontology. If we quantify over past and future objects, does this mean that they are on a par with present objects? Meyer never answers this question. But we find some revealing information in his dismissal of presentism. The triviality objection to presentism is the charge that presentism is not a substantial thesis. Meyer observes that presentism is typically formulated like this:

(P) Nothing exists that is not present

But (P) is ambiguous between these claims:

(P1) Nothing exists now that is not present

(P2) Nothing exists temporally that is not present

The first is trivial, and the second is false given that temporal existence is defined as existence at some time or other. The response that Meyer considers next is familiar: to express the presentist thesis, we should appeal to the notion of existence in (P) as existence simpliciter. Meyer’s reply is to deny that there is such a notion: if something exists in any sense, it must exist either temporally, at the actual world, or at some other possible world. This highlights an interesting feature of his view. While Meyer endorses eternalism over presentism, he rejects the one thing that eternalists and presentists often agree on: the existence simpliciter of a present time that is not merely a linguistic ersatz construction.

I think that one of the greatest challenges for Meyer’s view is the tension in the resulting picture. If there is no such thing as existence simpliciter, then Meyer’s only existence notion is the notion of existence at some time or other. But there is something odd in taking the most basic existence claims to be time-relative while simultaneously holding that times themselves are non-basic. This is especially so given that which ersatz times there are is a language dependent matter.

Some of the discussions in this book will be unsatisfying to those who are already familiar with the nuances of the debate, such as Meyer’s treatments of the triviality objection to presentism, the truthmaker principle, and relativity. Although Meyer devotes the last two chapters to squaring his view with relativity, they go by relatively quickly.

This caveat aside, The Nature of Time is essential reading for those working in the philosophy of time and modality. It addresses many of the main issues in the philosophy of time and provides an interesting new theory of time for consideration.