The Necessity of Errors

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John Roberts, The Necessity of Errors, Verso, 2011, 309pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844677399.

Reviewed by Paul M. Livingston, University of New Mexico


In a footnote to "A Plea for Excuses," J. L. Austin offers one of the precisely chosen examples that illustrate the keen ear for the language, and almost unmatched capacity for noting its fine distinctions, for which he and his method of reflection on ordinary language were justly notorious. If I, undertaking to kill my donkey, aim, shoot and then realize upon inspection that it was your donkey I have killed, I will report the mishap to you as a mistake. If, on the other hand, I aim and (in the time before I shoot, unnoticed by me) my donkey moves out of range and yours into it, I will say instead by way of explanation that I have shot yours by accident.[1]

Austin's registering of this fine distinction by means of the homespun example does not aim directly at the development of a more comprehensive theory of errors of which these (the mistake and the accident) would be specific types.  Instead, Austin encourages us to "imagine . . . varieties of situation," of which this is just one, in the course of a broader cultivation of the imagination, specifically to gain clarity about the varieties of excuses.[2] But in pleading for an investigation of excuses, Austin emphasizes that the topic, with its clear links to questions of action, justification, culpability, action, legality and conduct (which cannot, of course, be separated from the varieties of error or infelicity, practical or intellectual, that excuses are excuses for) is a "matter both contentious and practically important for everyone," and, as such, a fruitful field for philosophical consideration and reflective clarification.[3]

John Roberts's The Necessity of Errors considers the "error" in several of its instances, not simply in order to consolidate a theoretical understanding of "philosophy's relationship to truth" but, more "hesitant[ly]," to "place the 'error' back in practice in order to reflect on the condition of practice and the movement of thought and practice itself" (p. 5). Nevertheless, one of the main claims of the book is that error, in many of its varieties, is intimately connected with truth, so much so, in fact, that some kinds of "errors and mistakes" may indeed be said to "constitute knowledge and truth" (p. 5).

Across the "different theoretical and practical orders of error" (including science, political praxis, art, philosophy and psychoanalysis), Roberts argues that error cannot be dismissed as secondary or understood only as a privation of knowledge. Rather, in these domains, error is in various ways "productive," and this productivity should be understood in terms of what Roberts calls a "dialectic" of error. Here, he follows Hegel in invoking a dialectical systematization of the productiveness of error in which "error and truth become interdependent and co-determinate" (p. 8). This dialectical understanding of error, Roberts suggests, bears particular promise for a Marxist reflection on the present situation, which appears challenged to understand the structure and basis of the "error" or "'failures' of revolutionary praxis" that have continued to prevent the proletariat from becoming a "universal class" (p. 14).

Roberts's analysis of error is organized into broadly topical chapters. The first chapter discusses the relationship of error to the knowing subject in philosophy through Hegel. Here, Roberts breezily reviews conceptions of knowledge and the subject in Plato, Augustine, Descartes, and Locke, suggesting that these thinkers understand error only as the failure of a "possessing subject of truth," the "subject who labours to know" (p. 29). Kant is seen as the first to "historicize" reason in the sense of theorizing it as a "dynamic and historical process;" Kant's critical philosophy lends error a certain "dualistic" character in that, though it remains what is to be dispelled and vanquished at all cost, it also gains the positive status of what limits reason and so makes possible human self-knowledge (p. 39). But it was left to Hegel, according to Roberts, to undertake a "thorough going historicization" of the subject and of truth.  In the dialectic, error first gains the positive status of being a "necessary . . . element of truth" in that, at each stage, "the recognition and possession of truth is predicated on an emergent and immanent process of conceptualization" in which "what is discarded contributes through its inadequacies or contradictions to the historical labour of reason" (pp. 42-43).

In chapter 2, Roberts turns to the role of error in science, arguing for a "philosophy of science in which errors provide a determinate role" (p. 78). He emphasizes the challenges of understanding science as fundamentally a social activity, arguing that Popperian falsificationism and "Kuhnian conventionalism" (p. 73) alike do not go far enough in understanding the positive role of error in science's collective activity of "knowledge production" (p. 80). For Roberts, science must be seen as a "social practice" and an "alienated and partial system of knowledge" (p. 106) that is open to criticism as part of a broader set of social and historical conditions. From this perspective, in particular, it becomes possible to ask what does "science veil or impede in its claim to solve all the world's empirical problems" (p. 103).  Error in science is thus not seen simply as an epistemological matter, but as a practical concern whose critical demonstration allows the overcoming of science's inherent tendency to dissociate itself from its own social dimensions and implications (p. 102).

Chapter 3 turns to psychoanalysis, primarily as understood and practiced by Lacan. Suggestively, Roberts argues, within Lacanian psychoanalysis the subject is not understood as a stable bearer of unified self-knowledge, but rather as emerging in the "gap between consciousness and knowledge." Its condition for possibility is thus the "failure of reason," already suggested by Kant, in which reason as embodied in the concrete individual necessarily fails to live up to its own general and teleological demands (p. 110). This makes for a psychoanalytic practice that is essentially structured around error in the form of the "delays, veilings, misapprehensions, and misrecognitions" that always occur in the course of analysis and must be carefully managed in the process of transference (p. 119).  For Lacan, it is through such "fertile errors" that subjectivity and its truth themselves emerge.

Roberts next considers the complex and somewhat troubled relationship between psychoanalysis and Marxist politics since World War II. He suggests that psychoanalysis becomes a useful interlocutor for Marxist theory when, especially after the 1960s, Marxism's immanent critique of its own residual elements of humanism and positivism places it in the position of being, effectively, its own "analysand" and forces it to work out an "engaged" understanding of truth and historical agency, drawing important lessons from the psychoanalytic theory of the subject. Thus, in theorists such as Althusser, Balibar, Badiou, Laclau, and Žižek, Lacan's psychoanalysis becomes inseparably linked to the theorization of the historical subject and its "destitution, desubjectivization and deposition" (p. 126) as well as its positive possibilities of agency and transformative change.

Nevertheless, Roberts suggests, none of these theorists have fully succeeded in drawing out all of the potentially revolutionary implications of Lacanian psychoanalysis for an emancipatory Marxist politics.  One reason for this is that, in Althusser and Badiou at least, there is no developed "theory of error" of the type Roberts envisions. For instance, in Badiou's early Theory of the Subject, the more forceful and positive sense of the truth of the subject that emerges from his critique of Lacan means that Badiou no longer sees errors as productive in the course of the formation of the revolutionary subject; instead, the error is now seen simply as a deviation from the "correct practice" (p. 136) of a revolutionary politics, itself conceived in large part as a "vigilance" against errancy.

Chapter 4 expands upon this consideration of the interlinked problems of subjectivity, political action and error for the Marxist tradition, considering Engels' account, developed from Hegel, of the importance of the "involuntary, unwilled and unconscious" for the explanation of important historical moments such as that of the French Revolution and its ultimate failure. Through its consideration of the repeated and constant experience of counter-revolutionary retrenchment and restoration, Roberts argues, Marxist thought in the nineteenth and twentieth centuries engages with the question of the kinds of error that betray the possibility of proletarian emancipation, but also, and crucially, those errors that positively "sustain the creativity of the proletariat at the heart of the political process" (p. 173). In this vein, Roberts reads Victor Serge's correspondence with Trotsky, Henri Lefebvre's writings on praxis and irony, and Daniel Bensaïd's recent Marx for Our Times as exemplary instances of a Marxist "error theory" that collectively insists that the historical defeats of the working class through decades of Republican, Stalinist, and now neo-liberal capitalist retrenchment can in fact be the site of the greatest hopes for emancipation, in that, for essential reasons, "the collective revolutionary subject must speak and act from a position of critical weakness" (p. 188).

In the last substantive chapter, Roberts turns to the historically unfolding relationship of error and art, considering how "deliberate mistakes in execution and technique" (p. 211) become central to the development of impressionism in the latter half of the nineteenth century, and how this use of error is deepened in Symbolism and abstraction over the decades to follow. Roberts considers the theorization of the aesthetic subject of error in relation to questions of memory, forgetting, and classicism in Strindberg, Nietzsche, and Santayana, and briefly considers Rancière's recent discussions of the relationship between aesthetic and non-aesthetic reason in modernity and beyond.

Throughout these analyses, Roberts draws extremely broadly and eclectically from varied domains and instances to support his thesis of the productiveness of error and the usefulness of the "dialectics of error" which he promotes. This eclecticism is laudable, since it allows Roberts to draw interesting and useful connections among many regions of contemporary thought and practice. Nevertheless, it remains far from clear, as he himself sometimes acknowledges, that there is in fact anything like a unified sense of "error" or its meaning that emerges from all of these very diverse domains and phenomena.[4] In fact, it is worth noting that at one point or another in the book, Roberts treats, as instantiations of "error" or phenomena akin to it, all of the following (among others): the constitutive limitations of the Kantian or Hegelian subject (chapter 1), the specific errors of scientists in the experimental process (chapter 2); the constitutive misrecognition that structures all human relationships according to psychoanalysis (chapter 3); the miscalculations of revolutionary actors as well as the ways in which political praxis, quite apart from decision and agency, is subject to "chance" and the "aleatory" (chapter 4); and the deviations from realism introduced by Manet and the impressionists in painting (chapter 5).

It is prima facie doubtful whether there is, or should be, anything unified to say about all of these instances of what Roberts treats as a single phenomenon, and this often makes it difficult, in turn, to see what Roberts is really envisioning under the heading of the "dialectics" of error to which his argument ostensibly points. Thus, even granting Roberts's claim that many (if not all) of these types of infelicity in practice or theory might be seen as "productive," in various ways and according to differentdesiderata, it is easy to feel that Roberts's analysis would have benefitted from more of the kind of careful attention to distinctions that Austin's quick differentiation between two modalities of error (the "mistake" and the "accident"), for instance, so well exhibits.[5]

Roberts's analysis is at its most convincing when it takes up, in more specific and direct terms, what must be considered one of the most central questions facing Marxist thought today: how to understand the continuing failure of global and radical political change to emerge, even (and especially) in global conditions that make it increasingly urgent. Through his analyses of the prospects for revolutionary or transformative change and the historically developing theorization of these prospects, Roberts succeeds in showing that any hope for an emancipatory future today can only be based on a theorization that takes account of the necessity of errancy from what some varieties of Marxism have classically conceived as the teleology of history in order to comprehend and endure the "longue durée" of historical change and liberation.

Still, even with respect to this central problem, there are some ways in which the terms of Roberts's analysis may be less than ideally suited to its resolution in the contemporary context. For example, throughout his discussions of the possibilities of radical change, Roberts employs a classical Marxist language of class struggle (much of the analysis focuses on the question of the liberation of the "proletariat," as against various forms of "bourgeois" opposition) that may fit only imperfectly today's reality of shifting class positions and identities, and the more fluid and multiple kinds of change (beyond the old model of "revolution") that might be available today. And in the epistemological registers of Roberts's book, he often focuses his criticism on a "positivism" represented by figures such as Carnap and Popper, and treated critically as providing "scientific" legitimization to the reign of capitalism (e.g., pp. 102-104).  But in view of the fact that logical positivism, at least in its classical forms, is now a minority position at best, it is not clear how directly this line of criticism actually meets its mark. Finally, there is some reason to suspect that the relatively narrow template of "error" that Roberts assumes causes him to miss significant resources internal to some of the thinkers he considers for solving the very problems that he foregrounds. For instance, Roberts's discussion of Badiou's treatment of counter-revolutionary restoration focuses almost exclusively on the latter's early Theory of the Subject, passing over the significantly more detailed and articulated theory of the possible failures of the "event" and the correlative forms of "failed" evental subjectivity -- "reactive" or "obscurantist" -- that Badiou gives in Logics of Worlds.

Despite these limitations, though, Roberts has succeeded in raising and specifying some of the central problems that will necessarily, it seems, articulate emancipatory political thought for some time to come. It is to be hoped that readers will take up his invitation to meditate on the stakes of error and errancy, and the various and diverse ways in which the accidents, mistakes, missteps, miscalculations, contradictions and indeterminacies of our historical situation give rise to the possibility of thinking toward a better future.

[1] Austin, "A Plea for Excuses," in Philosophical Papers, 3rd edition, ed. by J. O. Urmson and G. J. Warnock (Oxford: Clarendon, 1979), p. 185; the example is also discussed by Stanley Cavell in "Austin at Criticism," in Must We Mean What we Say?, updated edition, (Cambridge, 2002), pp. 105-106.

[2] Austin, p. 186.

[3] Austin, p. 185.

[4] E.g., p. 255: "There is . . . no easy way of theoretically conjoining errors of omission and judgement across these different practices and disciplines, conditions and contexts".

[5] In chapter 4 (pp. 190-92), Roberts briefly draws a distinction between "errors" and "failures": the former occur in the course of an activity or program, whereas the later mark the dissolution or breakdown of such a program. But elsewhere in the book, Roberts again runs these together, or suggests they will be difficult to distinguish in practice.