The Neoplatonic Socrates

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Danielle A. Layne and Harold Tarrant (eds.), The Neoplatonic Socrates, University of Pennsylvania Press, 2014, 256pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780812246292.

Reviewed by Pauliina Remes, Uppsala University


According to an ossified view, Socrates and Neoplatonism are not only chronologically at the two extreme ends of ancient philosophy. They are also methodologically and philosophically worlds apart. Socrates wrote nothing, spent his time in open-ended discussions, uninterested in metaphysical questions. The Neoplatonic philosophers, however, worked with texts, producing extensive commentaries to classical philosophical texts, striving to reveal the dogmatic truth within them, and creating a more and more complex metaphysical system. Caricatures work because they highlight some striking, existing features of their objects. But their truth is not merely a simplification: to work, they have to hide and disregard some aspects and lie about others. Danielle A. Layne and Harold Tarrant's edited volume sets out to show how much more multifaceted the relationship between Neoplatonism and Socrates is and by doing so calls into question the caricature above.

The editors describe the motivation of the volume as one of revealing the significance of Socrates for the education and philosophy of late antiquity. The engagement with the Neoplatonic Socrates enhances the understanding of two different things: it enriches our view of Neoplatonic philosophy and of the late ancient thinkers as commentators on Plato and the character of Socrates. The second motivation, explicit in the introduction, is in the enhancement of possible alternative interpretations of Socrates. As the editors note, we should not pass over a half a millennium of careful readings of Socrates as a philosopher, as a model of a sage, and as a literary tool of Plato.

The volume includes an introduction, presenting the contents of the book, its theme, and the status quaestionis. The 10 chapters cover a wide range of source materials, from the middle-Platonic Plutarch and Apuleius (John F. Finamore) to Proclus (Crystal Addey, James M. Ambury, Layne; Michael Griffin), Hermias (Geert Roskam; Christina-Panagiota Manolea), Olympiodorus (Francois Renaud; Griffin) and Simplicius (Marilynn Lawrence), among others. An appendix summarises the persons and texts central for the reception of Socrates in late antiquity.

The chapters contain different approaches to the main theme. One highly interesting group illuminates Socrates' role in Plato's dialogical philosophical method, on Proclus' hermeneutics (Layne), as well as on how Olympiodorus understands the elenctic strategies of Socrates (Renaud). Another grouping is formed by studies on a distinctive Socratic feature: his daimonion (Finamore; Addey; also Manolea) or erotic art (Roskam; Ambury).

Somewhat distinctive in his approach is Griffin, who reveals how the Neoplatonists located Socrates and his interlocutors in the metaphysical hierarchy of the hypostases. This metaphysical locating is a way to appreciate Socrates' symbolic relevance in the dialogues. Roughly, Socrates symbolizes the intellectual part of the human soul, related to his interlocutors as an intellect is related to lower aspects of the soul. The chapter is related to Finamore's piece, according to which Middle-Platonists express a personal religious vision by locating Socrates daimonion in the hierarchy of religious entities or daemons.

A case apart is Lawrence (of this chapter more below), who targets the question of Socratic rationalism and its aftermath in late antiquity, especially as regards the possibility of akrasia. But most divergent from the rest is Tarrant's last chapter, which presents the results of his Australian research group's computer analyses on the commonest words in the Platonic corpus. What these analyses yield is a guide to the richness of Plato's different stylistic registers. Plato's literary mastery involves using different language registers within one and the same dialogue, depending often upon the role or voice that Socrates adopts or makes use of. Tarrant shows, furthermore, the occasions where these registers are already recognized by the Neoplatonic commentators. This is a technical but fascinating piece that offers food for thought for anyone trying to determine, for instance, which parts of the dialogues are mythical in the same sense and which not.

One clear undercurrent of the book is to enrich, and sometimes oppose, analytic trends or discursive methods of argument and logic, advocating a more literary reading. As this opposition has become quite common but is rarely subjected to investigation itself, let us pause and consider briefly both its merits and its limitations.

After decades of looking at ancient philosophy through the analytic philosophy lens, recently much work has been done to correct our reading and understanding of what ancient philosophy is. On many fronts, the picture has changed. As Pierre Hadot has forcefully argued, ancient philosophy was not only about arguments, it was also a way of life. The new consensus within Platonic studies is that the dialogues are not treatises from which one could extract single arguments without paying attention to their literary context. And one aspect of taking the literary context seriously is to acknowledge that philosophical persuasion is not only a matter of reasoning and valid argumentation: the personality of both the one being persuaded and the one trying to persuade have an impact on teaching and philosophical awakening.

This volume continues and contributes to this discussion. For the Neoplatonists, philosophising is not merely a matter of striving for and attaining truth. It is concurrent with advancement in self-knowledge. To be able to engage in philosophy requires moral improvement, but philosophy itself also enhances the process of self-transformation towards unity and goodness. The appreciation of this Socratic thematic is visible in the place that the Neoplatonists gave to Alcibiades I and the extensive late ancient commentaries written on this dialogue. These commentaries form an important part of the source materials for this volume.

What I find most striking is the picture painted of the subtlety of the Neoplatonists as interpreters of Plato. Some of their biases are foreign to us: often their Socrates is more systematic and religious than our contemporary equivalent (see e.g. Roskam). The book shows also that these thinkers anticipated many methodological ideas that we tend to think of as modern or even recent. The Neoplatonists were fully aware of the fact that Socrates and Plato did not necessarily subscribe to the entirely same philosophical or methodological stances (Renaud; Tarrant). Importantly, late ancient commentators considered the dialogues as literary units, "organic wholes" (esp. Layne), the treatment of which, even when done piece by piece in a detailed fashion, has to take the whole into account. Moreover, they realised that the dialogues proceed contextually: Plato's method is to acknowledge that different themes and interlocutors with different suitability of reception deserve a tailored and contextualized treatment (Addey; Renaud). Even Socrates is at times treated not simply as a paradigmatic sage but with personal dispositions of his own (Manolea).

All this is crucial and continues on the welcome path of revising one-sided readings termed today almost derogatively as 'analytic'. But to oppose literary style with argument raises some questions. One may ask what it is that besides argument, logic or dialectic is doing the work within the dialogues? What does one mean by 'nondiscursive', is this the same as 'literary', and if so, which literary aspects are denoted and what is their purport for the overall understanding of Plato and his commentators? While these questions are not directly tackled in the book, some clear suggestions about the nature of the nondiscursive aspects are provided.

A dialogue is not a list of the arguments, or even a sequence of smaller arguments composing some bigger unity or claim. As already indicated, a dialogue can exemplify a tailored and personal argument in ways that a treatise has difficulties in doing. Importantly, however, a dialogue contains a dynamic aspect. For example, Socrates' literary presence and action are seen as symbolic of intellectual virtue or even, if I may put it in this way, performative of his argument, providing a possibility for change and development. The reader is expected to grow and learn by emulation, not merely by cross-examination of inconsistency (Griffin). Further, Socrates embodies not only exemplary cognitive or moral states but the erotic force that motivates a self-improvement of the right sort (e.g. Ambury). Personal receptivity, too, is understood dynamically, as a changing state, raising the notion of right moment (kairos) as crucial in philosophical teaching and psychagogia (Addey).

One may wonder, however, whether opposing the argumentative or dialectical to the literary and nondiscursive is necessary, fruitful or even possible. Socrates, Plato, as well as their late ancient interpreters were all lovers of argument, and just as an analytic-argumentative reading cannot yield a fair picture of what goes on in Plato, so the literary approach cannot stand alone: within Plato, the performative relies and strives for values and ideals that are elsewhere argued for. And of course the erotic activity in the Platonic context is the activity of dialectic (as becomes clear in Ambury). Just as there is no dialectic without a motivation and desire for goodness and knowledge, there is no Platonic erotic without an intellectual or rational content. In here, I find Addey close to the target: rational is not opposed to irrational, divinational, or even to suprarational, but in subtle ways related to them. Or as Renault puts it, dramatic action is an integral part of the doctrinal content.

To give a comprehensive account of the significance of Socrates for late ancient philosophising, clearly more would have to be said than this book does about how the Neoplatonists commented on and interpreted Socratic philosophical claims or suggestions. Only one of the articles takes upon this kind of directly argumentative challenge: this is Lawrence's discussion of akrasia and the reception of Socratic rationalism. She provides a well-informed and interesting piece arguing for a modified rationalism in Simplicius: akrasia is possible, but only for the whole soul, and especially for an uneducated soul, not a perfect--or perfected--reason. Even here, however, for someone interested in the satisfactoriness of such an answer as a midway between rationalism and richer psychologies capable of explaining the phenomenon of akrasia, too much space is given to historical development of the discussion on akrasia and too little to the analysis of the fascinating passages that Lawrence deals with towards the end of the article.

This other side of the Socratic heritage--of considering, carefully, central Socratic tenets and the Neoplatonic interpretation of them--would, I am aware, have resulted in another kind of book and ultimately a massive volume. There is functionality and elegance in sticking to one's own approach. Readers, however, should come to this book with the right expectations: it presents high-quality Classical scholarship mostly occupied with what the Neoplatonists made of Socrates as a person, as an exemplary philosopher-teacher, and as a literary device of Plato. The carefully edited volume is strong on the late ancient understanding of Socratic-Platonic methodology and hermeneutics. With some exceptions, this is not a book about the content of Socratic arguments[1] and their Neoplatonic interpretation. Anyone intending to write such a book is well advised, however, to absorb the methodological wisdom of this volume first.

[1] In one sense, the approach chosen is a safe one: it is, of course, a complex question whether we can identify some arguments within Plato as more Socratic than others and which ones these would be.