The New Cambridge Companion to Nietzsche

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Tom Stern (ed.), The New Cambridge Companion to Nietzsche, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 447pp., $34.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781316613863.

Reviewed by Jonathan Mitchell, University of Manchester


This companion, edited by Tom Stern, comprises 16 chapters (and an Introduction) covering a range of topics in Nietzsche's philosophy. Given that it is billed as a companion, one would expect a balanced approach to debates in Nietzsche studies, alongside informative overviews. Unfortunately, the volume suffers from two central faults which undercut its ability to achieve this. On the one hand, a number of the chapters lack philosophical substance, reading more like discursive intellectual histories. On the other hand, the more philosophically inclined essays include misrepresentative snipes at 'analytic interpreters' of Nietzsche (mostly those notably absent from the volume). Nonetheless, there are worthwhile contributions; in what follows, I highlight these and draw attention to examples of where the volume was not up to standard.

Stern's introductory overview of Nietzsche's life and works will be helpful for those coming to Nietzsche for the first time. A few remarks are, however, worth making concerning Stern's presentation of the so-called 'mask' interpretation according to which 'Nietzsche [is] not committed to any particular claims he makes, and perhaps . . . finds philosophical significance in trying out different, even conflicting stances' (p. 18). Much obviously turns here on what is meant by 'trying out different, even conflicting stances'. If this merely means that we find passages where a view and its consequences are articulated, without it being Nietzsche's "official view" then that is hardly surprising. Stern's makes, however, much stronger claims. He suggests two ideas are in play. The first is 'Nietzsche's [purported] idea that our subjective, cognitive faculties, varying from person to person, constitute fundamental properties of (apparent objective) reality' (p. 18). This formulation is difficult to parse in a way which doesn't sound like a form of idealism. Cognitive faculties, say features of the human visual system, may certainly influence how that (apparent) objective reality seems to a perceiver (and in ways which may be distorting), but such features don't obviously constitute reality. Stern further frames this view as claiming that 'consequently my reality and your reality differ: there is no neutral or independent perspective, but trying out different perspectives might be valuable' (p. 18). However, the fact that subjects may bring to bear idiosyncratic cognitive faculties on their representations on reality doesn't imply that there isn't a fact of the matter about the nature of what's represented. Additionally, the idea that different human subjects -- 'me' and 'you' -- might have such radically different cognitive faculties that we literally 'constitute different realities' strains credibility.

Concerning Nietzsche, the central passage about such 'different perspectives' concerns affects, values, and knowledge (GM III 12). However, there Nietzsche says 'we can use the difference in perspectives and affective interpretations for knowledge . . . [such that] the more eyes, various eyes we are able to use for the same thing, the more complete will be our 'concept' of the thing, our 'objectivity''. That would be an odd thing to say if he merely thought that 'trying out different perspective might be valuable' (p. 18), and not instead, as he indicates, valuable for knowledge. Irrespective of these issues though, even if there were justification for attributing an idealist-perspectivism to Nietzsche, this would be a claim to which he is committed, rather than something supporting the 'mask' interpretation.

Second, Stern suggests the additional plank to the mask-interpretation is 'the idea that philosophy is (for Nietzsche) a form of self-expression and self-creation, with no one 'philosophy' being appropriate for all. The correct question, when confronting a philosophy, is not, therefore, 'is this true' but rather 'does this work (for me, for her)'' (p.18). Stern arguably confuses a point Nietzsche repeatedly makes about morality with a claim about philosophy. Nietzsche thought that no one morality was appropriate for all. Indeed, this anti-universalism serves as one plank of his critique of morality (in the pejorative sense). Moreover, Nietzsche is perspicuous in recognising that many self-proclaimed moralists espouse evaluative outlooks which while claiming to be 'what is objectively right or good' in fact merely serve their best interests. However, this is surely a descriptive rather than normative hypothesis; the idea is presumably, this is what people do, rather than this is how people should behave.

Concerning philosophy, Nietzsche doesn't recommend a self-conscious 'pick whatever philosophy works for you' attitude, which would be self-undermining. If I renounce the idea that the 'philosophy' I subscribe to is true (or truth-aiming) how could it have the salutary quasi-ethical effects of 'working for me'? Think of the Christian whose belief in an after-life, and other theistic propositions, have salutary effects. If they think their belief is merely a reflection of some emotional need they have, or that they have merely 'picked' the belief for its purported beneficial effects, then that would undermine that belief satisfying their emotional quasi-practical needs.

When providing his brief overview of possible interpretations of Nietzsche, one might have hoped that Stern would have been more critical of this 'mask' reading, or signalled significant problems with it. The contrast he draws with so-called 'Doctrinal' interpreters -- roughly those 'analytic' scholars who take Nietzsche to be staking out philosophical positions on issues of central importance to him (i.e., psychology, drives, values, affects) and who are a recurrent bogeyman in the volume -- is not entirely helpful either.

The 'Influencers and Interlocutors' (Part I) provides background for those coming to Nietzsche for the first time. Unfortunately, that background is not as philosophically rigorous as one would like. For example, consider Andreas Urs Sommer's chapter documenting, as its title suggest, 'What Nietzsche Did and Did not read'. While there is interesting material here for the specialist, this chapter will be of little use to students or more philosophically minded readers. There is a significant difference between using what Nietzsche read (or did not) to situate him in a historical context which makes sense of his substantive philosophical claims (see, e.g. Leiter 2015; ch.2 'Intellectual History and Background'), and mere documenting of the former -- Sommer's piece rarely goes beyond documenting. Robert Wicks chapter on Schopenhauer is better in this regard and will be helpful for those looking to draw connections between Nietzsche and Schopenhauer.

The most contentious contribution of the volume is Stephen Mulhall's 'On Nietzsche's Legacy'. It is pegged as a meta-commentary on the last 30 years of Anglophone Nietzsche scholarship, mostly focused on so-called 'analytic' interpretations -- the spoiler is that Mulhall (like Stern) isn't a fan. Mulhall even goes as far to suggest that such interpreters suffer from reflexive myopia: 'to the extent that the new analytic reception of Nietzsche generally tends to treat his contribution to philosophy as reducible without significant remainder to a series of distinct contributions to specific sub-branches of the disciple (e.g., ethics, mind, epistemology) then . . . their reception of Nietzsche is marked by the very ascetic ideal he criticises' (p. 140). This is surprising since two 'exemplars' of the approach which is presumably Mulhall's target -- Leiter and Katsafanas -- see these 'sub-disciplines' as inextricably tied together in Nietzsche works. Leiter's (2019) 'Naturalistic' (or 'Humean') Nietzsche, whose philosophical psychology is based in unconscious drives and type-facts, connects with the 'Therapeutic' Nietzsche's cultural project of ridding nascent higher-types of their false consciousness by affecting them at a drive-level beneath rational persuasion (Leiter also emphasises quasi-ethical themes of Amor Fati throughout his work). Katsafanas (2016), on the other hand, offers an understanding of Nietzsche's philosophical psychology which holds open space for forms of reflective choice and efficacious willing which allows him to provide a positive gloss on specific Nietzschean ethical themes like self-creation and freedom, so tying ethics and mind together in a distinctive way. Katsafanas also consistently emphasises the role of culture and history for Nietzsche in shaping our drives and affects.

It would be helpful, and useful to students, to have a more impartial commentary on the reception of Nietzsche in the Anglophone world, and one which did not engage in straw-manning. Nonetheless, contained within the chapter are substantive critical remarks on Leiter's Naturalistic reading which warrant further comment. According to Leiter (2015, 2019), Nietzsche's naturalism is methodological in the sense that the philosophical explanations he offers aim (broadly) at continuity with the methods, or more aptly methods of explanation, of the successful empirical sciences of the day, which for Nietzsche were the burgeoning 19th-century life-sciences of physiology and biology. As Leiter puts it: 'Human beings are fundamentally bodily organisms, creatures whose physiology explains most or all of their conscious life and behaviour. Nietzsche adds to this Materialist doctrine the proto-Freudian idea that the unconscious psychic life of the person [e.g., the drives] is also of paramount importance in the causal determination of conscious life and behaviour' (Leiter 2019: 3). The result is the Nietzschean Doctrine of Types: Each person has a more or less fixed psycho-physical constitution, which defines him as a particular type of person. The resulting philosophical psychology is nonetheless speculative -- in much the way that Hume's moral psychology was a speculative account of human nature which was methodologically continuous with certain deterministic Newtonian patterns of explanations in physics. Furthermore, the proffered claims are not to be confirmed in the way that, for example, a physiological claim of Nietzsche's day would have been. Instead, what Nietzsche offers is a speculative human psychology which seeks the general causal determinants of the broadest range of human behaviour (acting, thinking, perceiving, feeling), in such a way that those explanations are of-a-piece with kinds of explanations offered in the burgeoning life-sciences of his day.

Mulhall criticises Leiter's reading on numerous scores, but let me focus on one. He claims that the notion of 'empirical sciences' is ill-defined, such that the characterisation of naturalism becomes insubstantial -- it is unclear whether it extends beyond the natural sciences to the social sciences which concern empirical inquiry into 'cultural explanations' of human behaviour. If it does extend so widely then it becomes 'hard to see what modes of inquiry fall outside this category -- except of course, those invoking supernatural or transcendental factors. But that negative specification of naturalism is precisely what dissatisfied Leiter at the outset, and which he is supposed to be providing a positive alternative' (p. 128). In response, note that Leiter is explicit in emphasising that the empirical sciences that so-impressed Nietzsche were the burgeoning life-sciences of biology and physiology, and that this clearly has a substantial effect on how Nietzsche's naturalism is understood (say contrastingly with how Hume's naturalism was informed by the Newtonian paradigm in physics). So, the criticism is misplaced. At least part of the substance to Leiter's characterisation of Nietzsche's naturalism comes not from delimiting what is and what is not to count as a successful empirical science -- we, broad brush, already know that (psychology is one, astrology isn't) -- but rather in specifying more narrowly the specific empirical sciences with which Nietzsche sought a kind of methodological (and at least on certain specific points substantive) continuity with, and which informed the kinds of explanations, he was seeking to provide.

Mulhall's preference for Bernard Williams' characterisation of these matters -- the so-called 'minimalist' moral psychology -- hardly fares any better qua being substantial. Mulhall glosses this attitude 'realistic' rather than' naturalistic': 'what is at issue is not the application of an already defined scientific programme but rather an informed interpretation of some human experiences and activities in relation to others' (p. 130). But the former is a caricature of Nietzsche's naturalism on Leiter's reading: in explaining human behaviour by reference to unconscious type-facts specified in terms of drives and affects (whose basis is physiological) Nietzsche would not be applying some 'already defined scientific programme' -- there simply wasn't scientific physio-psychology of this kind in Nietzsche's day. Rather he would be engaged in a speculative philosophical psychology which evinces a methodological continuity with the successful sciences of his day.

The 'Selected Texts' portion of the volume (Part II) covers The Birth of Tragedy (Paul Daniels), Thus Spoke Zarathustra (Dirk Johnson), Beyond Good and Evil (Robert Pippin) and On the Genealogy of Morality (Christa Acampora). These provide, to varying degrees, helpful commentaries on those texts. Acampora's is the best of these, displaying sensitivity to the text, and introducing themes in an informative way.

Pippin's contribution is idiosyncratic by comparison. He makes much of Nietzsche's use of stylistic devices in Beyond Good and Evil to push the idea that Nietzsche's philosophy isn't (at least primarily) a matter of certain 'fixed' doctrines whose truth-value we should be interested in (a recurrent theme in Stern and Mulhall also). As Pippin puts it in his conclusion: 'the approach taken here would mean that the basic question for any reader is not primarily: is what Nietzsche is saying about the 'will to power' true? The prior questions, ones we may never get fully beyond, are on the order of: What is actually being said, and especially, what is the point of saying it? What is he trying to do by saying it'? (p. 214). There is a modicum of sense here: given certain aspects of Nietzsche's style, we may never be certain that we have ascertained the correct view on what he is saying on any given matter. However, Pippin's point is exaggerated. A legitimate and fairly basic question would be given a reasonable reconstruction of Nietzsche's notion of the will to power, which is grounded in the texts and aims to be faithful to them, is that hypothesis true. Notably, there is also a price that comes with seeing Nietzsche as always, rather than just sometimes, engaged in an esoteric meta-project of not just stating (albeit in suggestive and non-committal ways) his philosophical views, but always saying things for some never explicitly stated 'effects' ('what he is trying to do by saying it'). It makes the interpretive project closer to that of trying to uncover Nietzsche's 'hidden intentions', something which lends itself to a form of speculation unconstrained by textual evidence.

Part III concerns 'Truth History and Science', the highlight of which is Sebastian Gardner's 'Nietzsche on the Arts and the Sciences'. Gardner provides a suggestive commentary on the issue of what Nietzsche wants from art and science, and how the resulting picture may be consistent. Gardner sums up the tension nicely: 'the difficulties we face in interpreting Nietzsche's view of art and science begin with the fact that . . . in many places Nietzsche appears to accept as given the authority of the natural sciences . . . while elsewhere he seems to regard aesthetic experience as a source, paradigm, and guarantor of normativity . . . ' (p. 311). Simply put: can Nietzsche sustain both a commitment to the epistemic value of natural science and the normative value of art and aesthetic experience? Gardner provides reasons for resisting readings that would involve subordinating art to science, stressing the aesthetic and evaluative perspectives that figure centrally in parts of Nietzsche's texts. However, it is unclear who would subscribe to the subordination in the first instance. In a now recurring oddity of the volume, Gardner points to the so-called 'analytic readers of Nietzsche . . . [who] make natural science sovereign' (p. 311). This characterisation of 'analytic readers' is an unhelpful caricature, even if one were to consider just naturalistic interpretations. And some 'analytic' readers (e.g., Poellner and Ridley) write extensively about aesthetic experience in Nietzsche, but do not 'make natural science sovereign'.

Gardner sums Nietzsche's outlook as follows: '[It] combines an affirmation that natural science is what fixes the truth of our beliefs with a denial that the scientific image of the world determines its own reception. Nietzsche's reasons for crediting science with truth, to the extent that he sees need to articulate them, are most often simply rehearsals of Enlightenment anti-supernaturalism and empiricist conventional wisdom. His basis for denying that science fills out the space of reason, by contrast, is profoundly original' (p. 314). The latter, Gardner claims, turns on how the sceptical impetus of science is turned on science itself, which reveals that 'modern science cannot . . . pretend to take the place of value as we understand it, it must necessarily appear to us as a circumscribed limited enterprise' (p. 315). Given this, art can play a unique function: 'what art provides is a surrogate Archimedean point, a place within the manifest image through which the scientific image can be mediated, and values revalued, without capitulation to the moral interpretation of existence' (p. 317).

While Gardner does not spell this out in detail, the idea that (i) there is a thread running through Nietzsche's work which aims to cultivate a de-moralised quasi-aesthetic experience which is connected to value (a state Gardner claims 'tends towards plenitude'), and (ii) this experience is intended to ease the fall of the devaluing of the standpoint of science, ­­seems a fruitful interpretative line. One idea worth exploring in this area, but which Gardner does not touch upon, is the role of affective-evaluative experience in this aspect of Nietzsche's thought, specifically a de-moralised receptivity to phenomenal values as instantiated in the mental life of other subjects. Think for example of the nadir of phenomenal disvalue Nietzsche sees represented by the mental life of 'men of ressentiment', and the apex of value he locates in a certain kind of outlook-looking receptivity to 'higher values' exemplified by the mentality of the 'noble spirit'.

In Part IV, 'Will, Value and Culture', Lawrence Hatab discusses Nietzsche's concept of the will to power, most interestingly, its relation to the idea of resistance. Hatab glosses this issue as follows: 'Since power can only involve resistance, then one's power to overcome is essentially tied to a counter-power; if resistance were eliminated, if one's counter-power were destroyed or even neutralised by sheer domination, one's power would evaporate, it would no longer be power' (p. 336). This makes for difficult reading, especially when coupled with Hatab's talk of the will to power naming a 'tensional force-field', a notion which isn't sufficiently clarified. Hatab further says that 'Power . . . is, not something that one has, full stop; it is more originally something towards which one strives. Will 'towards' power as a drive is not actually goal-directed but activity directed; its 'aim' is the perpetuation of overcoming, not a completed state' (p. 337). However, as many commentators have pointed out, the will to power cannot be simply a will to resistance per se, nor can it be willing a state of perpetual frustration. The resistances to be overcome have to be embedded in a context which renders them meaningful for the subject, as resistances worth overcoming. Furthermore, I have to aim at successfully overcoming them. These are complex issues, which -- as those versed in current Nietzsche scholarship will be aware -- are more neatly framed in terms of an interpretation of the will to power as providing an account of the psychological structure of desire.

For Reginster, for example, it provides an account of human desire in which the ends of our first-order desires are sought in conjunction with a second-order desire for the feeling of power; a hedonic experience occasioned by overcoming resistances (Reginster 2006: 118-147). This second-order desire -- the will to power as the will to overcoming resistance -- is dependent on those first-order desires, insofar as it can only get determinate content and occasion for expression through them. This means we cannot informatively characterise the resistances -- which in willing power we seek to overcome -- independently of those determinate first-order desires. This picture generates what Reginster highlights as a 'paradox' of the will to power since what it takes to satisfy the will to power is (1) some first-order desire for a determinate end; (2) resistance to the realisation of this determinate end (3); and actual success in overcoming this resistance. Given this set, the conditions of the satisfaction of the will to power imply its dissatisfaction: 'The overcoming of resistance eliminates it, but the presence of such resistance is a necessary condition of satisfaction of the will to power. Hence, the satisfaction of the will to power implies its own dissatisfaction, in the sense, that it necessarily brings it about' (Reginster 2007: 40). As Nietzsche brilliantly puts it, 'Indeed, who was not defeated in his victory?' (Z, III 12[30]). This reading captures why Nietzsche describes the will to power as insatiable, as always in 'search' for new resistances to be overcome. Pursuing power in this sense necessarily takes the form of an indefinite, recurrent and renewed striving, in a context of determinate valued other ends.

There are further questions about will to power as a psychological thesis, but couching it at this level makes sense of the majority of what is sensible that Nietzsche has to say on the matter, and explains his personal-level talk of feelings of power, dissatisfaction, displeasure. Hatab claims, at the start of the chapter, that he favours an interpretation of the notion as a 'counter-metaphysical multiplicity of force relations' and 'function of valuation and life-affirmation'. The latter aspect only gets a passing treatment at the end of the chapter. The former aspect remains somewhat mysterious if not cashed out in psychological terms. Given how perplexing the notion of the will to power is one might have hoped for a more sober approach in an introductory companion, setting out the available interpretative options and criticisms of them in detail.

In the best contribution of the volume, Michael Forster provides an overview of the debate concerning Nietzsche on free will, providing historical context by way of references to Socrates, Plato and the Stoics. This piece is recommended for those coming to this debate for the first time looking to get a sense of the different directions of travel viz. Leiter's deflationary approach (and deflationary reading of the much-debated GM II: 2 sovereign individual passage) vs the Gemes/Janaway putatively 'positive' approach. Forster is also perspicuous in noting that the kind of positive conception of freedom that Nietzsche may endorse doesn't push him back to endorsing moral responsibility, guilt or punishment -- notions which Forster highlights (as Leiter and others have), are bound up with the contra-causal free will Nietzsche rejects. Forster also resists Leiter's 'persuasive definition' reading of passages on freedom, the idea that Nietzsche radically revises the content of the concept of freedom, while exploiting the positive valence the concept has for readers, so as to reach them on an 'affective' level by associating his ideals with values in which his readers are emotionally invested. Forster alternatively and intriguingly suggests that Nietzsche positive conception 'is actually a variant of the very oldest conception of free well; namely that of the Stoics, who regarded free will as 'deterministic, vanishingly rare and more or less identical with human excellence (not a precondition of human excellence or vice)' (p. 390)

Overall this volume is idiosyncratic and mixed. Instead of a state-of-the-art snapshot of Nietzsche-studies married with perspicuous introductions and overviews of central texts, many of the contributions lacked philosophical depth. Those that were of a more philosophical bent flirted with obscurity and verbosity, not infrequently straw-manning the so-called analytic interpretations. That being said, Gardner's and Forster's contributions are worth reading, the latter being a fine example of the required form and standard of content for a contribution to a companion. It was a shame that many of the other contributions fell short of this standard.


Katsafanas, P (2016) The Nietzschean Self. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Leiter, B. (2015) Nietzsche on Morality (second edition). London: Routledge

--. (2019) Moral Psychology with Nietzsche. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Nietzsche, F. (1997) On the Genealogy of Morality. Ed. K.A. Pearson. Trans. C. Diethe. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

--. (2006) Thus Spoke Zarathustra. Ed. A.D. Caro and R. Pippin. Trans. A D. Caro. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Poellner, P. (2012) 'Aestheticist Ethics' in C. Janaway and S. Roberston (eds) Nietzsche, Naturalism and Normativity, 52-80, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Reginster, B. (2006), The Affirmation of Life. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.

--. (2007) 'Will to Power and the Ethics of Creativity' in B. Leiter and N. Sinhababu (eds) Nietzsche and Morality, 32-56. Oxford: Oxford University Press.