The New Century: Bergsonism, Phenomenology, and Responses to Modern Science

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Keith Ansell-Pearson and Alan D. Schrift (eds.), The New Century: Bergsonism, Phenomenology, and Responses to Modern Science, 438 pp., volume 3 of Alan D. Schrift (ed.), The History of Continental Philosophy (8 volumes), University of Chicago Press, 2010, 2700pp., $800.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226740461.

Reviewed by Michael R. Kelly, Boston College


The New Century is the third of an eight volume set on the history of continental philosophy. It is aptly titled, capturing the innovative spirit of the early twentieth century, even in philosophy, with a nod toward one of its forgotten idols -- Henri Bergson -- and his emphasis on genesis, novelty, and creativity. For both those new to and those steeped in continental philosophy, it provides useful overviews of  most of the most significant thinkers, issues, and movements of the continental tradition from (roughly) the 1890s to the 1930s (ix). Its selection of essays on central and marginal figures, movements, and themes of significance for early continental philosophy is complemented by a generous and helpful (twenty page) timeline of philosophical, cultural, and political events from the seventeenth century to the present (381-400). The contributions, generally of very high quality, are written, by and large, by leading scholars. For any given topic, the extensive (but not tedious) bibliographic information and footnotes should facilitate further research. It is a largely accessible, reliable, and thus recommendable collection that often combines the range of an encyclopedia and the substance of an article.

Like the series as a whole, the volume presents the methods of continental thought and its representative thinkers and issues in the context of "figures and developments outside philosophy (in the sciences, social sciences, mathematics, art, politics and culture)" as well as "philosophers not usually associated with continental philosophy" (viii) rather than "a chronologically organized series of 'great thinker' essays". The editors frame the volume according to the spirit of the times understood as a set of varied responses to nineteenth-century positivism and scientism more specifically (5). As Keith Ansell-Pearson notes in his detailed introduction, 'continental' thinkers at the turn of the 'new century' – thinkers as diverse as its inaugurators, Nietzsche, Bergson, and Husserl -- pursued a unified 'vocation' of regaining philosophy's independence and reasserting culture's future "faith in the human as the being in search of truth and rational modes of being" (4). These thinkers respected the regional inquiries of the sciences while developing the conviction "that the 'true being' is not a possession the human has, like the self-evidence of the 'I am', but . . . echoing Nietzsche, a task" (3). For these thinkers, who one could call the 'founders' of continental philosophy, the task was one of creating anew (in Bergson's case) or renewing (in Husserl's case) philosophy's "own sources of knowledge" rather than "imitating developments in the method of science" (6).

The volume begins and ends with essays on Bergson -- a laudable rhetorical decision. Ansell-Pearson, Paul-Antoine Miquel, and Michael Vaughan's "Responses to Evolution" introduces the reader to Bergson's Creative Evolution and its "ambitious and rich" attempt to explain how "philosophy and science can reach a new rapport concerning questions of life" (348). They begin with a clear review of Bergson's alternative to Herbert Spencers' evolutionism. Their account of Deleuze's assessment of Bergson's insight that philosophy must "pass from" the "transcendental" approach "to a genetic one" -- indeed a "double genesis" that overcomes the tendency to reify intellect or matter, mind or world -- sets up their claim about the relevance of this Bergsonian notion for contemporary biology, including the "failure of the human genome project to explain life in mechanical terms." (370). For Bergson, they succinctly put it, "mechanism lacks an adequate philosophy of life as a whole, vitalism lacks an adequate philosophy of particular living organisms" (370-71).

Returning to the collection's first essay, John Mullarkey's excellent "Henri Bergson" provides a compelling rhetorical presentation of Bergson's undeserved philosophical obsolescence and a clear and comprehensive overview of Bergson's philosophy. Countering the "comic-book Bergson" we inherit today, Mullarkey establishes "an image of a thinker whose influence on philosophy's language has been immense yet rarely acknowledged" (21). He cleverly takes the language, i.e., the salient concepts, of Bergson's thought and demonstrates how "the language of French philosophy . . . expresses a latent Bergsonism 'acting itself out'" (21-2). By explicating Bergson's "favored terms" (22) as they recur and develop in his major works, Mullarkey informs the reader about Bergson's methodologies (holism, intuition, immanence, pluralism, nonphilosophy), metaphysics (the real, time, beyond subject and object), naturalism (consciousness, the body, nature) and normativity (life, ethics, antireductionism). As Mullarkey complements his presentation of Bergson by identifying significant historical connections between Bergson and Kant, Husserl, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Jean-Paul Sartre, Luce Irigaray, Deleuze, Michel Henry, etc., I can think of no better place to start for anyone interested in learning about Bergson's philosophy or seeking paths of research in it.

The next two essays focus on the movements of neo-Kantianism and French sociology. "Neo-Kantianism in Germany and France" by Sebastian Luft and Fabien Capeillères defends a mission statement of sorts -- that "the history of nineteenth and early twentieth century philosophy cannot adequately be assessed without knowledge of neo-Kantianism" (49) -- by providing an overview of the debates within and between the two schools of German neo-Kantian thought, the Marburg school (Hermann Cohen, Paul Natorp, and Ernst Cassier) and the Southwest school (Emil Lask, Heinrich Rickert and Wilhelm Windelband), as well as a sketch of the French neo-Kantians (Charles Renouvier, Jule Lachelier, Èmile Boutroux, and Léon Brunschvig). Presenting a somewhat one-sided German neo-Kantian story, Luft and Capeillères interestingly review the cultural-political climate in which German neo-Kantianism grew. Its content could have placed more emphasis on the major issues these neo-Kantians believed themselves to be confronting: the materialism controversy. Nevertheless, they establish the originality of neo-Kantianism not only for its time, but also for its resurgent relevance for today's scholars of the "history of philosophy . . . philosophy of culture, and 'continental philosophy', broadly construed," "contemporary philosophy of mind, epistemology, and philosophy of science," and even political philosophy due to neo-Kantianism "gaining leverage in the US with the works and the influence of John Rawls" (49, 81).

This article prepares the reader for Mike Gane's "The Emergence of French Sociology." Gane nicely explains how and why Èmile Durkheim and Marcel Mauss, by way of "radicalizing" the neo-Kantian thought of Cousin and Renouvier, reject August Comte's positive polity and Marxist communism and engage other major sociologists of the time such as John Stuart Mill and Spencer (91). Gane submits that 'Durkheimians' tried to put French neo-Kantian "methodology and logic . . . to use" as a "sophisticated therapeutic discipline that could work out objective analyses of social pathology" and thus avoid "taking a path into a profoundly reactionary mysticism or scholasticism" (110, 91, 110). In the process, Gane pays due attention to Mauss' influential theory of the gift by which he diverged from Durkheim, revolutionized the field of ethnology, and anticipated postmodern fascination with this gesture (98ff).

The volume rejects the strict chronological approach. I'll take a minor liberty and treat chapters four, five, and seven together -- Michael Friedman and Thomas Ryckman's "Analytic and Continental Traditions," Thomas Nenon's "Edmund Husserl," and Miguel de Beistegui's "The Early Heidegger," respectively. I find their content related and think they are the finest essays in the collection and a model for essays in these types of volumes.

Freidman and Ryckman arrange their lucid and accessible introduction to the analytic/continental debate around a very sensible thesis. They argue effectively that one can understand much about the analytic/continental situation "by concentrating on a single fundamental issue that divided them . . . the distinct but closely related disciplines Kant . . . called formal and transcendental logic" (113). What follows is a well-ordered, concise, and informative overview of Kant's use of these notions and their influence on 'psychologists' such as John Stuart Mill, the development of psychologism, and the debate on psychologism between Gottlob Frege and Husserl (114-120). They develop the widening divide between Husserl and Frege around the issue of the move to intuition away from a purely logical foundation for mathematics and analysis. For Carnap, following Frege, "formal logic . . . wholly takes the place of transcendental logic" (125) insofar as "all talk of 'intuition' must be logically reconstructed, all talk of . . . 'constitution' executed by a 'transcendental subject' . . . replaced by purely logical constructions" (124). A commendably efficient account of German neo-Kantianism substantively drives forward this formal/transcendental logic narrative so that the reader comes to see how the Frege/Carnap and Husserl/Heidegger pairing further widens the gulf between analytic and continental philosophy. "Just as Carnap brings the mathematical 'logicization' of experience begun by the Marburg School to completion . . . Heidegger . . . completes the 'de-logicization' of experience implicit in . . . the Southwest School" (138). This disagreement comes to a head in Carnap's (in)famous engagement with Heidegger's claim, "Das Nichts selbst nichtet." And yet the authors insightfully remind the reader that an underlying issue unites these thinkers, for "Carnap is determined to resist . . . at all costs" the "metaphysical thought of the type Heidegger is trying to awaken . . . on the basis of a prior overthrow of the philosophical authority and primacy of logic and the exact sciences" (144). This essay prudently reminds us that the "intellectual gulf within German academic philosophy" did not exist before the early 1930s and that these philosophers "still spoke the same philosophical language and actively engaged one another in a common set of philosophical problems" (112).

Nenon's impressive contribution on Husserl is as clear as it is concise and comprehensive. Nenon introduces the reader to Husserl's descriptive 'psychology' or phenomenology in Logical Investigations (carefully presenting the essentials of the preface on psychologism and each of the six investigations) and explains both Husserl's maturing distinction of "phenomenology from descriptive psychology" (159) and his development of "genetic phenomenology" as a complement to "static" phenomenology (163ff.). What is most remarkable is the grace with which Nenon takes the reader on a thoroughly informative and substantive tour through the labyrinth of Husserl's technical terminology, including the problem of psychologism; intentionality and empty- and filled-intentions (154-55); categorical-objects, -intuitions, and -intentions (156); the epochè, phenomenological-, and eidetic-reductions (158-59); eidetic-variations (159-60); the theory of evidence (155) and the consciousness of inner-time (161-62); and the life-world (166), intersubjectivity (162), and empathy. It is a text to which even the advanced student of Husserl can return to be refreshed on the myriad elements of Husserl's thought, and it is the finest introduction to Husserl of this type and length that I know.

In "The Early Heidegger" de Beistegui reveals himself to be a most attentive student of Heidegger, for his entry is a model and confirmation of Heidegger's enduring conviction from the time of his habilitation that "philosophy and the history of philosophy are not two separate disciplines [and] in fact, the history of philosophy is the only way into philosophy" (191-92). He offers with exceptional clarity what amounts to an introduction to Being and Time. Rather than expositing Heidegger's 1927 masterpiece directly, he provides a philosophical history of Heidegger's early writings that eventually would come to fruition in Heidegger's classic. Using Heidegger's notions of "meaning," "existence," and the "hermeneutical as" in his 1919 lectures on the definition of philosophy (196) as well as  Heidegger's earliest efforts to bring together phenomenology as fundamental ontology and the "phenomenological hermeneutics of facticity" in his 1922 "phenomenological interpretations of Aristotle" (or the so-called "Natorp report"), de Beistegui builds an account of the "first, embryonic version of Being and Time" and its developing notions of the Dasein's "ecstatic" character, the "existentials" of factical life, "fallenness," etc. (198-202). While each of these notions points toward the Dasein's being toward death, de Beistegui leaves his presentation of this material until he arrives chronologically at the 1925 Marburg lectures, "The History of the Concept of Time," in which Heidegger himself addressed the matter.  De Beistegui nicely outlines Dasein as a "project" with "moods or dispositions" that reveal the ineradicable thrownness and passivity of life. What's more remarkable, he does not shy away from difficult and substantial issues in Heidegger's thought. Indeed, de Beistegui offers insightful glosses on many of Heidegger's early and perplexing claims, e.g., "time is a . . . temporalizing" (208), and he closes the essay with an account of why Heidegger's philosophical focus must 'turn' as a direct unfolding of his commitment to revealing "the meaning of being itself (as opposed to that of Dasein)" (209).

Between the Husserl and Heidegger chapters is an entry on "Max Scheler" written by Dan Zahavi, arguably today's foremost commentator on and delegate for phenomenology. Zahavi's characteristically clear and concise prose is on display in his account of Scheler's pursuit of phenomenology as eidetic analysis and his concept of person as it influences his "logic of the heart" -- "a fundamentally Pascalian claim of Scheler's . . . that our emotions are characterized by an a priori content and subject to a priori laws" (177). Zahavi neatly presents Scheler's distinction between empathy and sympathy -- the former concerns "a basic understanding of expressive others," the latter "adds care or concern for the other" (178) -- and then proceeds to make a case for the contribution that Scheler's theories of empathy and analogy and expressive phenomena can make to the contemporary problem of "other minds." Zahavi convincingly presents Scheler's as a phenomenology that can provide a unique account of "direct and noninferential experience of the emotional life of others" (182-4). This is unfortunately the shortest essay in the volume, and one might wish (or even have expected) to have heard more on Scheler's non-formal axiology. While Zahavi admits his contribution "pays scant attention to [Scheler's] value theory," favoring instead what he takes "to constitute Scheler's more enduring contribution" (174), it would have been valuable to learn what a phenomenological authority such as Zahavi thinks about Scheler's axiology.

Leonard H. Ehrlich's "Karl Jaspers" makes for very interesting and informative reading about a thinker who attempts to think irrationality together with rationality, the existential with the scientific, and thus explores the tension of "polar opposites" with respect to "the posture Existenz takes as it directs itself to transcendence" (218). Ehrlich provides a clear and engaging overview of Jasper's discussion of these opposites: "defiance and devotion (or piety)," "descent and ascent" within time, "the law of the day and the passion for night" that draws us toward and blinds us to reason and duty, respectively, and the "wealth of the many and the one" (218-220). The essay is at its best when Ehrlich heuristically alludes to Kierkegaard, Job, and Dostoyevsky and identifies Jasper's disagreements with Heidegger (most specifically) on the question of the meaning of being, which Jaspers believes is "unresolvable" insofar as "Being does not provide man with direction by his stepping back and 'letting Being be'" (222). With an account of Jasper's relations to Kant, Hegel, German Idealism, and Kierkegaard with respect to the importance of transcendence (224-29), Ehrlich's essay nicely repeats without overemphasizing the significance of this dimension of Jasper's "phenomenology" of religious-existence, for "only relatedness to transcendence can affirm one's independence from the conditionality of world-being, and thus confirm one's freedom" (228-29). The reader of this essay will appreciate that the "centerpiece of Jasper's metaphysics is his phenomenology of existential relations to transcendence" (218).

Babette Babich's "Early Continental Philosophy of Science" crackles with spunk and insightfulness. She is at times, one might say, feisty regarding attempts to reduce continental philosophy of science to analytic philosophy of science. Her polemic, however, is not merely or even primarily rhetorical. It stems from her insight that mainstream science itself, primarily physics, has marginalized certain members of its own community, primarily geology and chemistry, and analytic philosophers of science dogmatically accept this ideology and imitate this hegemony. Indeed, following a brief overview of what philosophers like Nietzsche and Heidegger have had to say about technology's relation to and influence on science, she prefaces her account of the content of continental philosophy of science by claiming that the "ideology" of "mainstream history of science" tends "toward 'leaving things out,' perhaps in the interest of minimizing complexity" (271). Such ideology creates prejudicial "obstacles" for "any revolutionary theory" such as geologist Alfred Lothar Wegener's protractedly "ridiculed" 1912 theory of continental drift (272). Mainstream science and philosophy of science tailored to physics (274), she argues, also marginalizes the philosophy of chemistry. Here she cites Friedrich Adolf Paneth's repudiation of "the reduction of chemistry to physics for the very phenomenological and critical reason that the aim of physics is ultimately to reduce 'sensory qualities to quantitative determinations'," whereas chemistry is "essentially non-mathematical" (275). Babich closes her case by turning to Gödel, a thinker who engaged the philosophy of science and the problems of physics and mathematical logic but apparently not in the conventional way, and whose continued

refusal . . . within analytic philosophy to this day . . . stands as an example, one above many, of the closed nature of certain domains within academic discourse and the unwillingness to allow dissenting voices coming from other traditions to have a share in the conversation of philosophy (272, 286).

It is a challenging and informative essay regardless of which side of the 'divide' one chooses to stand.

John Fennell and Bob Plant's "Ludwig Wittgenstein" presents a fine introduction to the central issues in Wittgenstein's thought and major works. Tracing the shift from Wittgenstein's Tractatus to his Philosophical Investigations and On Certainty, their essay will fill (where it exists) a lacuna in the 'continentalist's' awareness of the history of analytic philosophy (assuming one agrees that analysts have not themselves forgotten Wittgenstein). Wittgenstein's concepts of ordinary language, utterance, language games, and family resemblance are presented clearly (290-93), and his naturalism is nicely laid out in relation to his theory of grammar and grammatical truths (295). The authors turn in the second half of the essay to constructing surprising yet interesting comparisons between Wittgenstein and four characteristically continental philosophers, Nietzsche, Alfred Schutz (on trust), Levinas (on ethics and the face) and Lyotard (on language games). These are all very measured and sober comparisons, but of the four the one between Nietzsche and Wittgenstein on philosophy's "therapeutic" value and their similar (but certainly not identical) effort to "dissolve" philosophical problems by not getting "tangled up in the snares of grammar" is most convincing (297, 299). It is surprising, however, that we hear almost nothing about Wittgenstein's relation to Husserl, Heidegger, or Merleau-Ponty. Even if these are more predictable continental interlocutors with Wittgenstein, some mention of their relations seems apt for an introduction to the latter in a volume on early continental philosophy.

Adrian Johnston's "Freud and Continental Philosophy" operates, for what it's worth, from an expressly Lacanian orientation (322). He cleverly organizes his introduction to Freud's influential work -- on the matters of the unconscious, drives, instinct, "memory . . . mind and body, the meaning of literature and art, the nature of emotions, the function of religion, and the structure of social groups" (320) -- according to the reporter's key questions of who, what, where, when, why, and how. Johnston moreover provides useful distinctions between Freud and the other 'masters of suspicion', Marx and Nietzsche (320-21), and situates Freud in the context of German Idealism, materialism, existentialism, phenomenology, and critical theory. Somewhat disappointingly, however, he does not explore the notion of drives beyond a few mentions (325, 326, 331, 344), omits a discussion of the Oedipus complex, and limits his account of Freud's influential and controversial critique of religion, culture, and ethics in Civilization and its Discontents to two passing mentions – about which all of readers who turn to this piece likely may wish to learn more (331, 334).

Errors of omission and redundancy are inevitable in such ambitious and ranging collections, and this volume is not immune to such concerns. Two pieces in particular seem redundant at the expense of two matters one might otherwise expect to find in a volume covering 'the new century'. First, Diane Perpich's "Phenomenology at Home and Abroad," a nicely written essay in its own right, seems oddly misplaced. On the one hand, it extends beyond the volume's circumscribed time-frame into the thought of Jean-Paul Sartre, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, and Emmanuel Levinas, and yet it does so, on the other hand, only after redundantly adumbrating the thought of Husserl and Heidegger, treated in greater detail elsewhere in this volume. As this piece adds little not already found in the volume's other essays, an essay on early existentialism might have been more valuable. Indeed, this topic seems as perspicuously absent in this volume as it is in philosophy outside undergraduate philosophy curriculums. An essay that treated, for example, Ukrainian philosopher Leon Shetov's All Things are Possible (1905), Martin Buber's I and Thou (1922), Gabriel Marcel's "Existence and Objectivity" (1925), and Jean-Paul Sartre's early literary writings such as Nausea (1938), not only would adhere to the time-period under consideration, but also would reinforce the editors' commitment to the claim to cover "developments outside philosophy . . . and some [thinkers] not usually associated with continental philosophy" (viii).

Second, the topic of neo-Kantianism, despite its obvious importance for this time period, is treated extensively both in the essay by Luft and Capeillères and in the essay by Friedman and Ryckman. The former essay is the longest in the volume, ranging forty pages, and as I have said noticeably gives more attention to the German neo-Kantians, dedicating only ten pages to the French. This imbalance would not be a problem were it not also the case that the extended treatment of German neo-Kantianism seems to come at the expense of an adequate overview of, for instance, Felix Ravision, whose work is now being seen as increasingly relevant for its influence on Bergson, phenomenologists such as Merleau-Ponty, and issues such as habit and attention. Insofar as the editors allowed these authors a bit of chronological latitude in treating neo-Kantian writings from as early as Hermann von Helmotltz's 1855 Über das Sehen des Menschen (50-51), the volume could (and the series certainly should) have included an essay on Franz Brentano given his well-noted influence on Husserl, Heidegger, and Freud.

As it is an exceptional feature of this volume, however, that such errors are so restricted and thus do not compromise the overall high quality of the work's content, I have no doubt that this work is one of the finer achievements of its kind and one that will aid both newcomers to continental philosophy (students and analytic philosophers) and seasoned scholars of continental philosophy.