The New French Philosophy

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Ian James, The New French Philosophy, Polity, 2012, 221pp., $24.95 (pbk) ISBN 9780745648064.

Reviewed by Joe Hughes, University of Minnesota


Ian James's book is a tour de force. He presents an immense amount of extremely difficult material in strikingly clear prose and with consistent conceptual precision. The book's most interesting aspect is arguably not the material itself, though, but the institutional and cultural work the text very consciously performs through its construction and naming of a new constellation of new French philosophers. Like John Mullarkey's Post-Continental Philosophy (Continuum, 2006) and Alexander Galloway's Les nouveaux réalistes (Léo Scheer, 2010), James surveys a set of thinkers who have been translated and cited in conjunction with one another over the past fifteen years. But Mullarkey never raised the question of whether his four post-continental thinkers might constitute a canon. Galloway actively resisted this gesture. James, however, embraces it. He argues that Mullarkey has already traced the contours of this canon, and, if James doesn't cite Galloway, he might rightly argue that, like it or not, Les nouveaux réalistes only adds support to this new articulation of what French philosophy, in a broadly Anglo-American context, looks like now.

From the perspective of these three texts, that new canon would consist of some combination of the following thinkers:




           Alain Badiou

           Alain Badiou

         Alain Badiou

       François Laruelle

        François Laruelle

      François Laruelle

        Bernard Stiegler

         Bernard Stiegler

        Giles Deleuze

       Catherine Malabou

       Catherine Malabou

       Michel Henry

       Jacques Rancière

      Quentin Meillassoux


        Jean-Luc Marion

     Mehdi Belhaj Kacem


        Jean-Luc Nancy



James is not content to let this constellation stand as a provisional and emergent structure that has arisen out of those discourses in which these figures tend to figure (cultural criticism, media studies, various forms of philosophy) and into which it might return. In the introduction he argues that there is, in fact, a characteristic that unites these philosophers: each philosopher performs a break with the "linguistic, textual or discursive paradigm of (post-) structuralism" (5). We might take issue with this claim on multiple grounds. Even its basic assumption that French thought of the 1960's performed a linguistic turn was already overstated in the 1970's and 1980's. It missed, for example, what was originary about originary writing or it forgot that Deleuze's one essay on structuralism was a radical replaying of structuralist concepts (in the service of a profoundly anti-structuralist thought). But James's indirect endorsement of this narrative emphasizes an important aspect of the old French philosophy -- namely, that it was an Anglo-American phenomenon smuggled into the academy by disciplines that were themselves undergoing a linguistic turn. James's decision to structure his narrative around this rejection of the linguistic turn is thus particularly canny. It simultaneously positions his book in relation to the institutional past of French philosophy and to the current nonhuman, speculative, object-oriented, or realist turn.

The book is organized as a series of introductory expositions of each new French philosopher. James's chapters consistently fulfill two basic exegetical commitments. First, James has each chapter address the totality of an oeuvre; and second, in each case he grounds these totalizing readings on a foundational concept or problematic. As a result, the chapters are eminently readable but also sufficiently complex to challenge readers more familiar with the material. Rather than summarizing all seven chapters, I'll focus on three and discuss the ways in which James negotiates each thinker's body of work.

James's chapter on Bernard Stiegler is an exemplar of both exegetical commitments. He convincingly ties Stiegler's more recent arguments for an industrial politics of the spirit to his early readings of Husserl and Heidegger. But this totalizing reading is clearly grounded in the central problematic of Stiegler's first major text, Technics and Time I: the elaboration of what Stiegler calls the "technological rooting of all relation to time" (61). Stiegler shares Husserl's and Heidegger's concerns with the way in which technology reconfigures the world; but unlike them, Stiegler installs technics at the most fundamental level of our constitutive passivity. There is no temporal synthesis (or ekstasis) that does not make a necessary detour through technics. As James puts it: for Stiegler the "structure of protention and retention, constitutive of time, always passes through, engages and is engaged by an exteriority of technical objects and technical prosthetics" (65). James does an admirable job of following this thesis to its conclusions.

From here, he moves on rather quickly to Stiegler's politics. If the foundational structures of consciousness are unavoidably tied to technics, then the very nature of humanity (67), as well as its historical becoming (69), is unavoidably tied to technics as well. This leads to a provocative thesis. "The movement of history," James writes, is "governed by a process in which dominant technical systems develop into something new and are then subsequently accompanied by the emergence of new cultural forms which are programmed by those new systems" (69). This historical and political prioritization of technics is one of the more difficult aspects of Stiegler's work. The issues at stake come out well if we foreground the titular allusion of the final section of James' chapter. James calls this section "What is to be done?," and while Lenin is never named, his spectral presence resonates throughout the discussion of Stiegler's politics as the position exactly opposite Stiegler's. James tells us, for example, that Stiegler rejects the position of the "Marxist scientist-philosopher (e.g. Althusser)" (79). Rather than advocating for strategic social assemblage, Stiegler advocates still more individuation and the cultivation of "singular affects" (76); rather than attending to those dans la misère, Stiegler is concerned with la misère symbolique (77); rather than assuming that, from the start, technics "converge with the material modes of production, consumption and economic exchange," he sees this convergence merely as a "risk" which we must do everything to prevent (72-73). One does not need be a Leninist to wonder whether this shifting of the territory of politics to a "politics of technics" is not also, simultaneously, a way of ceding the territory of politics. Stiegler's thought potentially has the resources to avoid or redirect this kind of reading, but the particular way that reading might work has yet to be articulated.

In his discussion of Catherine Malabou, James aims again at a totalizing reading. His long chapter surveys the major texts of Malabou's oeuvre and distills them also to a basic principle: plasticity. This is, of course, significantly easier to do for Malabou, to the point that it presents a significant difficulty for critical commentary. Because Malabou herself returns again and again to the concept of plasticity, it is tempting to ignore the specificity of each return, or of what she calls the "plasticity of the concept of plasticity" (Plasticity at the Dusk of Writing, Columbia, 2009, 11), and to treat plasticity as a simple concept without a genealogy. James resists this reading. He devotes the chapter to outlining the various forms this concept has taken across Malabou's encounters with Hegel, Heidegger, and neuroscience.

He begins with a discussion of Malabou's first book, The Future of Hegel (1996). In this text, Malabou extracts the concept of plasticity from a passing comment in the "Preface" of the Phenomenology on the difference between speculative and logical propositions (§64) and slowly transforms it until it becomes something like the basic motor of the dialectic itself. As James puts it, Malabou tries to show that plasticity is "the key principle of the entire Hegelian system insofar as it governs both the temporal movement and the by turns dissolving and synthesizing force of dialectics itself" (87). The concept reappears, two books later, in Le Change Heidegger: Du fantastique en philosophie (2004). Again, James lucidly describes the way in which Malabou, by tracing Heidegger's different uses of Wandeln, Wandlungen and Verwandlungen, rediscovers the logic of plasticity, but now on the territory of what Heidegger, in Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics, called the productive imagination. As James glosses the argument, what we discover by following Heidegger's changes is: "Being presents itself to thought not in the clarity and exactitude of concepts or conceptual determination, but rather in the plasticity of images and phantasms" (93).

The final form of this concept appears in two of Malabou's most recent works -- What Should We Do with Our Brain? (2004) and The New Wounded (2007). Here, again, plasticity is figured as a non-conceptual poetic force, but now in the completely different register of neuroplasticity (98). As James points out, this new turn opens up the possibility of a refreshing reorientation of philosophical approaches to neuroscience insofar as Malabou resists the current eliminativist impulse of philosophy in the direction of an ethics of becoming (one of the basic implications of neuroplasticity, Malabou argues, is that our brains aren't yet complete and we thus need to ask what we can do with them) (102). But James also judiciously emphasizes that this turn to neuroscience raises a number of difficulties which remain unresolved in Malabou's work, both with respect to the specific nature of the relationship between philosophy and neuroscience (96) as well as with respect to what the program of neuro-psychoanalysis which Malabou proposes might actually look like (106).

James' final chapter is an account of François Laruelle's work. One of the paradoxes generated by Laruelle's texts is that despite their immense difficulty most commentaries on them -- from Ray Brassier's early essays to Mullarkey and Galloway -- are highly readable. James' reading is no exception. Again, James surveys the major texts and the back alleys of Laruelle's oeuvre. And again, he distills them to a basic principle: Laruelle's texts all pursue the radical immanence of the One (161). As James puts it, Laruelle tries to think a One that "is undivided, absolutely autonomous and, of itself, entirely indifferent and resistant to conceptual transcendence and understanding" (162). The rest of the chapter traces the ways in which non-philosophy responds to this demand of thinking a radically resistant One.

The first task of non-philosophy from this perspective is to resist the temptation to accede to the One through the understanding, and this means resisting what Laruelle considers to be the foundational gesture of all philosophy: the philosophical decision. As James glosses it, the philosophical decision is the basic gesture of any philosophy confronting the intractability of the real. In order to make the real tractable, philosophy "posits 'being' or existence on the one hand and its representation in concepts or categories on the other. It then constructs, or legislates for, the equivalence, identity or unity of these in the universality of philosophical truths and foundations" (164). If non-philosophy is not philosophy, it is because it resists this demand of the understanding for conceptual tractability. On the contrary, it affirms that thought cannot determine the One but must, in turn, allow itself to be determined. Two basic consequences follow from this. First, thinking can no longer be understood to be grounded in a subject -- neither in the structures of a subject nor in its capacities (171). One need not trace the functioning of the thinking mind before one accedes to being. Most of the chapter is thus devoted to a lucid description of the way in which Laruelle's concepts -- from the vision-in-one to determination-in-the-last-instance and, later, cloning -- are constructed to characterize the basic processes of the One's unilateral causality. Second, James argues that non-philosophy must elaborate "a very different . . . discursive gesture or technique" (160). It is this emphasis on the way in which non-philosophy is "necessarily and inherently a performative mode of writing" (160) that distinguishes James' reading from others and ensures its continuing relevance to Laruelle's more recent "theoretical installations" in books like Photo-Fiction, A Non-Standard Aesthetics (Univocal, 2012).

James’ exposition of these thinkers is striking in multiple ways. I have already emphasized the clarity of each chapter as well as its fidelity to James’s robust exegetical commitments. We might also be struck by their obviousness. His readings of each philosopher are entirely uncontroversial. I don’t mean this as a criticism; on the contrary, the consistent presentation of basic concepts in a clear and precise way is one of the book’s greatest strengths. Finally, we might be struck by the absence of any sustained discussion, in most of James’s expositions, of the basic principle organizing this new canon. James rarely reinforces his opening claim that each thinker finds a new way of going beyond the linguistic turn. In fact, in the conclusion, he proposes two more principles organizing the canon: (1) each thinker develops a new technique for the practice of philosophy (181-86), and (2) each thinker attempts to go beyond the anti-foundationalism of post-structuralism (187). But, again, the expositions of each thinker hardly develop either of these initiatives.

If we turn to the chapters themselves to find a more general principle not articulated in the introduction or conclusion, things get even messier. We might be tempted to propose that each thinker reactivates, after Deleuze and Derrida, the phenomenological problem of constitutive temporality—James lucidly grounds Marion, Malabou and Stiegler in this problematic, for example—but this hardly works for Laruelle or Badiou. Or we might be tempted to argue that all of these thinkers represent a collective break with phenomenological methods. But again, while this might work for Laruelle or Badiou, Marion and Stiegler are clearly writing within the phenomenological tradition while Malabou and Nancy are drawing on its resources (and for this reason, the closely related—but not identical—claims that the principle uniting these thinkers is either a commitment to realism or a commitment to materialism also remain unconvincing). This lack of a unifying principle is not necessarily a weakness. The unstable frame does nothing to diminish the rigor of James’ expositions. It becomes a problem only if we want the canon to exist outside the dynamics of the institutional context which supports it and in which it was shaped—or when it prevents us from acknowledging and engaging those dynamics.