The New Hegelians: Politics and Philosophy in the Hegelian School

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Douglas Moggach (ed.), The New Hegelians: Politics and Philosophy in the Hegelian School, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 360pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521854970.

Reviewed by Katerina Deligiorgi, University of Sussex


Framed by contemporary as well as historical concerns, this collection aims to re-acquaint us with the work of the Left Hegelians. The guiding thought is that we stand to gain by looking afresh at the ideas of the thinkers that make up that collectivity. As Douglas Moggach states in the Introduction, their writings address directly current concerns and offer us the opportunity to form a 'robust understanding of the modern self and its interactions, which can sustain both freedom and social solidarity' (Moggach 23).

The contributors to this volume set themselves two distinct aims. First they seek to re-assess figures such as Eduard Gans or Edgar Bauer, and to offer new perspectives on familiar debates. This is not just a matter of mapping out the immediate post-Hegelian landscape. It is an exercise of thinking in context, so that particular individuals are seen as reacting to as well as shaping the intellectual environment of the 1830s and 40s. This historical task is amply fulfilled. Some of the most interesting findings in this richly informative and carefully edited collection are about the intricate lines of transmission of Hegelian ideas, new and old, and also about the absorption and transformation of an older -- Kantian -- heritage. The second aim is considerably more ambitious and philosophically more challenging: to find in Hegel, his followers and immediate critics 'resources for grasping central theoretical issues of modernity' and, following from this, to work out with the help of Hegelian ideas 'new categories of analysis' in the social and political domain (Moggach 2). It is this aspiration that gives the collection its name, 'New Hegelians', a name chosen to 'emphasise the currency and relevance of their reflections to understanding and refashioning ongoing debates about freedom, selfhood, and the social bond' (ibid.). The key 'theoretical issue of modernity' that concerns the authors examined in this book is how to conceptualise modern subjectivity so that the social bond is seen as enabling and sustaining freedom, rather than as presenting a check to individual freedom. Their answers take the form of various attempts to re-think 'selfhood' and 'freedom'. Moggach claims that the unifying feature of such attempts is republicanism. Clearly, this is not the promised 'new category'. As a key ingredient in the reception of Hegelian ideas, however, it is intended to open up new ways of bringing this strand of political and social thought to bear on current concerns and, by the same token, to make available new streams of republican thought to contemporary debates. The idea of a left Hegelian republicanism might strike some people as problematic and reading this volume will not do much to alter this impression. Of much of the positive argument in this book it can be said that to the extent that it is republican it is not new, and to the extent that it is new it is not convincing. A great deal of the interest here lies, however, precisely in the failures of left Hegelian thought to provide credible alternatives to received ideas of selfhood and freedom. 

A notable feature of the output of many new Hegelians is that they are prompted to write directly in response to practical concerns. Eduard Gans, for instance, uses his witness of the 'emaciated and wretched' poor of England to tackle the question of poverty. Bruno Bauer responds to the 'crisis provoked by the collapse of a society that had been divided into estates' (Tomba 91). Whilst the reasons for this ready assumption of a public intellectual role are never fully explored, it is clear that it is central to the self-conception of these writers. A question that is given great attention concerns the ways in which these public intellectuals seek to fulfil their role, through political and economic criticism, criticism of religion, and reconstructive historical narrative. Each of these approaches has roots in Hegel but also in Kant and Rousseau. Indeed, both rhetorically and substantively much of what the new Hegelians write shows a debt to Rousseau, and, one might add, to Rousseau's own torn halves between solitary individuality and citizenship in a (safely distant, ideal) polis.

Given that the problem of self and society for those thinkers is presented as urgently practical, it is disappointing to find so little that can be regarded as a plausibly practical solution. Gans's idea of the 'free corporation', may well be, as Norbert Waszek argues, 'capable of anticipating a proto-unionist perspective' (Waszek 41), but it is hard not to think that it is Saint-Simonian associationism that does most of the work here. The charge of abstraction is more routinely levelled against Feuerbach. Howard Williams's sympathetic but ultimately damning portrayal of Feuerbach's 'emotive materialism' (Williams 65) pays heed to the egoistic, anti-philosophical and incipiently anarchistic elements of his thought. Feuerbach's idea of the 'whole man', the man who combines reason, love and will, represents an attempt to reach beyond philosophy and thus to go against the grain of 'the present age which prefers the sign to the signified, the copy to the original' (cited in Breckman, 83). Breckman suggests that this reaching out in the hope of grasping hold of an elusive immediacy is also at the same time a philosophical refutation of the thesis of the identity of thought and being. Feuerbach's rebellion against identity-philosophy can be seen though also as simply placing the ambitions of identity philosophy outside philosophy. This is clear in his attempted philosophical translation of religion into anthropology, which stakes a claim about the truth of religion and maintains that such truth is to be found not in philosophy, but in life. Motivating the left Hegelian engagement with Christianity is their attempt to reconcile a discourse of religious heteronomy that contains the radically emancipatory message of freedom in Christ with the Kantian conception of human dignity in terms of a morality of autonomy. This encounter of Christianity and Enlightenment is articulated in Lessing's 'Education of Humankind', Kant's Religionschrift, and Hegel's so-called 'theological' writings. Feuerbach, David Strauss, and Bruno Bauer stand at the close of an intellectual paradigm that becomes etiolated once the historical teleology that underpins it, concerning the gradual transformation of religious content by a self-conscious and self-consciously modern subject, takes the absurd form of an 'omnivorous self-consciousness that recognises itself behind every mask and sees every window as a mirror' (Breckman 89).

The ambition to articulate a theory that is somehow self-transcending or self-negating can be found also in Bruno Bauer's idea of criticism. Part diagnosis, through a historical-philosophical analysis of the sources of the political crisis precipitated by the dissolution of the Estates, and part dissolution of existing social and political categories, criticism becomes 'the terrorism of true theory' (cited in Breckman 93). For Bauer, criticism is the 'only power to illuminate the self-deception of the existent, and places itself above it'. True theory is 'terroristic' because it dissolves the existent and refuses to put anything new in its place; it is also impotent because 'all discourse necessarily employs existing categories', and thus is inevitably tied to the old. In practice, as can be seen in Bauer's treatment of the notion of 'exclusiveness', criticism yields detailed historical analyses of political and religious organisations through which Bauer seeks to show that exclusion is the constitutive principle of such organisations (Tomba 102). Criticism of exclusiveness on the grounds that it is arbitrary is premised on a commitment to universalism and freedom that remains however resolutely and consistently void of content; 'universalism' and 'freedom' are simply articulations of the dissolving, 'terroristic', self-understanding of the modern critic.

If a faint echo of a hyperbolic interpretation of autonomy can be detected behind this pledge to perpetual revolution in thought, the hope of bringing about a new way of life shapes an explicit theory of revolution. Edgar Bauer, humorously portraying himself as 'bloodthirstiness itself' in a mock-epic poem about the leftist grouping Die Freien -- 'the free ones' --, describes the task of revolution as the extermination of 'everything that wants to make man, this spirit-filled creature, into a spiritless, thought-fearing machine' (cited in v.d.Luft 141). Edgar Bauer's radicalism commits him to a historicism that is also self-negating. Using the example of the burning of the library of Alexandria, he naturalises destruction as the necessity of 'every new principle'; the more energetic and powerful the new principle, he argues, 'the more nearly total the annihilation that proceeds from it is' (cited in v.d.Luft 145). The erasing of history for the sake of the new is paralleled by the erasing of society for the sake of pure self-determination in Max Stirner's defence of anarchic egoism. The egoist pursues his goals without regard for the law: 'in all cases where his advantage runs against the state's [the egoist] can satisfy himself only by crime' (cited in Leopold 190). Thus it is that we encounter here a familiar figure, what Iris Murdoch called the modern Mephistophelic individual. It is hard to resist Arnold Ruge's estimation of the writings of Die Freien as nihilistic hubris. 

Where is new Hegelian republicanism then? There is a hint in Bruno Bauer's idea of the state as potentially the domain of 'self-transcendence of particulars' (Moggach 132), maybe even in Stirner's conception of the mature Einziger who overcomes both childish natural interests and youthful intellectual ideals (Stepelevich 174).  But to gain a sense of the public side of such commitments we need to turn to Engels and Marx. As Gareth Stedman Jones argues, Engels's account of the condition of Manchester workers is not pure rapportage. Rather it is a carefully constructed Left Hegelian narrative of fall and redemption aiming to show the condition of the modern proletarian as 'singular and universal', a 'single, undifferentiated, propertyless subject', the dehumanised agent of the regeneration of mankind (Jones 218). Engels's artful shaping of the particular, concrete and empirically accessible suggests that it is very difficult indeed to achieve what the young Marx recommends, namely to define the 'materialist connection of men with one another', to be 'real', to be historically specific (de Souza 253). In this connection, Marx's early efforts in political analysis and theory take the added significance of aiming to deliver on the 'real' and finally to 'go beyond idealism without content' (Chitty 221). Andrew Chitty's focus on the idea of the state helps throw light on this by drawing attention to a different strand of young Hegelian thought that takes up Enlightenment ideas of publicity and public reasoning and seeks to embed them in political institutions. This attempted fusion of Kant and Hegel is briefly envisaged by Arnold Ruge and forms, on Chitty's account, the source for Marx's early conception of the state and precursor of his later notion of human 'productive forces' that underpin his theory of history (Chitty 236). Be this as it may, it is notable that in the translation of the Hegelian ideal of freedom into the language of life processes, possibilities of fruitful opposition within a recognisably organised public life become null and void. What we find instead is an increasing focus on the domain of work and the hope, canvassed here by Sean Sayers, that 'necessary labour can indeed be a free and self-realising activity' (Sayers 270). But, one may well wonder here, whether this 'self' is and can be any other than the worker self. As Ardis Collins comments, in a concluding essay that offers a thoughtful and considered old Hegelian response, it is productivity that 'generates the self-consciousness of the worker' and so it is difficult to see how such a world can develop a consciousness equipped for any other kind of activity (Collins 282). This book is instructive in a way that the new Hegelians would be in a position to appreciate, not as a lesson of republicanism but as a provocation of thought.