The New Intuitionism

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Jill Graper Hernandez (ed.), The New Intuitionism, Continuum, 2011, 248pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441152480

Reviewed by David Kaspar, St. John's University, New York


The return of intuitionism is one of the recent success stories in ethics. At the center of the story is Robert Audi's work. The New Intuitionism includes the latest developments in the discussion of intuitionism, from both constructive and critical standpoints. After considering both the critical and the constructive essays in this collection, one walks away with the sense that intuitionism is ascendant. Audi begins the volume with a brief introductory essay and closes it with a lengthy essay, which includes new additions to his system. Six of the eight essays by other contributors are ethical in content; two focus on epistemological issues. All are more or less related to Audi's work.

Even after Audi published his seminal essay, 'Intuitionism, Pluralism, and the Foundations of Ethics', in 1996, it was still easy to ignore moral intuitionism, for intuitionism had long been the moral theory most everyone agreed was mistaken. Audi's focus on reframing the epistemology of intuitionism succeeded in making it a harder target to attack. Rethinking the conditions of self-evident cognition along contemporary lines, carefully distinguishing first-order from second-order matters, and distancing intuitionism from the more incautious statements of his predecessors has opened doors for its reception. The subsequent success of intuitionism has drawn new attacks, many of which are based on the fact that people have moral disagreement.

'New intuitionism' is a label given to Audi's theory. In his introductory essay he distinguishes it from early analytic intuitionism: 'It corrects the epistemology of traditional intuitionism; it extends its metaphysics; it adds to its normative content; and it integrates it with a version of Kantian ethics' (7). One of the attractive features of Audi's approach is his insistence that his theory is compatible with general philosophical positions traditionally at odds with intuitionism. He claims that his theory does not presuppose non-natural moral properties, and that it could be developed on empiricist, rather than rationalist, lines. As we acknowledge recent advances in intuitionism, we should keep in mind that, despite errors and omissions, early analytic intuitionists have additional resources we would be well advised to explore, something Audi appears to do in his concluding essay.

I'll begin by briefly summarizing the essays in order of their appearance and then discuss a number of them.

Walter Sinnott-Armstrong leads off with 'An Empirical Challenge to Moral Intuitionism'. This essay, which I'll discuss below, is his latest attempt to employ empirical research to challenge intuitionism. The next two essays, which I'll also treat below, explore new possibilities in moral intuitionism. Hugh McCann argues that conative experiences can undergird intuitionism more effectively than cognition in his 'Conative Intuitionism'. 'Moral Facts and the Centrality of Intuitions' by Christopher Kulp outlines an account of how moral intuitions are related to the particular states of affairs we call moral facts.

Ralph Kennedy, in the first of the two epistemic essays, 'Intuitionism and Perceptual Representation', raises questions about the epistemology of Audi's intuitionism in the area of perceptual knowledge. 'Moral Perception and Knowledge by Principles' by Carla Bagnoli provides an interesting constructivist critique of the intuitionist employment of principles. Clayton Littlejohn's 'Ethical Intuitionism and Moral Skepticism' provides a thorough response to moral skeptical attacks on intuitionism. Next, Peter Graham's 'Psychological Capacity and Positive Epistemic Status', the second epistemological essay, inquires into the relations different levels of psychological capacity have to different epistemic statuses.

In 'Reasonable Disagreement: Sidgwick's Principle and Audi's Intuitionism', Roger Crisp lays out his latest argument from disagreement against Audi's intuitionism. Lastly, Robert Audi's concluding essay, 'Intuitions, Intuitionism, and Moral Judgment', sketches the newest developments in his intuitionism, some of these are responses to criticisms, others bring into play rival intuitionist theories, and still others simply expand his theoretical resources. I'll treat these final two essays below.

I'll discuss the constructive intuitionist essays first. One avenue of inquiry that is new, at least to me, is opened up by McCann in his 'Conative Intuitionism'. The topic of his essay is value, and how we 'apprehend' it, to use McCann's term. The main intuitionist view is that value is cognized by us, that there is an epistemic relation between subject and value. McCann's alternative is stated in the following way: 'our primary awareness of value and rightness, and of their opposites, comes by way of conation -- that is, by way of experiences such as desire and felt obligation, of enjoyment and moral satisfaction' (29). Acknowledging that this view is not entirely new, McCann is correct that it is currently underexplored. He says that 'Desire and aversion convey information to us of what is good and bad' (31). And 'when I experience the desire for some exercise, getting some exercise presents itself to me not just as desired but as desirable' (Ibid). Reflections along these lines lead him to the striking claim that 'value realism posits a kind of teleology innate in the world' (45).

The conative approach to value apprehension has points to recommend it. First, our desiring things does often seem to convey information about the value of the things desired. Second, as McCann notes, a conative approach to value certainly has an easier time explaining how we are moved to act on value than a purely cognitivist account of value apprehension. But while I certainly agree that the conative aspect of value apprehension calls for further inquiry, I am not as confident that it will be found to be a distinct workable alternative to cognitive intuitionism. The main reason is that I'm not sure how value is supposed to be apprehended in desire, or what 'apprehension' might mean in this context.

Kulp brings a strong conviction of the strength of our moral knowledge to his 'Moral Facts and the Centrality of Intuitions', going so far as to say 'intuitive moral knowledge is ubiquitous' (63). The aim of his essay is to connect such moral intuitions to the particular moral facts they capture. This is perhaps the hardest problem intuitionism must face. Audi has successfully removed the roadblocks for a theory of self-evidence to be viable. It remains to be explained how it's possible that our intuitions make contact with the world. Kulp claims that 'the most epistemically central of moral intuitions are intuitions which have particular moral facts as their objects' (ibid.), providing as an example of a particular moral fact that it is morally wrong for anyone to shoot and kill him as he writes his paper. Such knowledge of particular moral facts, he claims, is epistemically prior to our intuitive knowledge of moral generalizations.

On the moral facts end of the matter, Kulp seems on target. A treatment of different issues concerning facts sets the stage for the discussion of moral facts. His outline makes them appear less mysterious than they might be thought to be. The analog of particular numerical facts, such as the three apples sitting on a table, helps edge intuitionism forward in this respect. The numerical property of three, which belongs to the apples, is likened to a moral property, such as being wrong, that is present in a moral state of affairs. Both exist as properties in addition to the present physical properties, and neither is reducible to them. The question raised for Kulp's account, it seems to me, concerns a priori moral intuitions. How can knowledge of particular moral facts be epistemically prior to self-evident moral principles? It seems we all know it would be wrong for someone to kill us, not because of our acquaintance with the particular fact of our being killed, but rather because we know a priori that murder is wrong.

Audi covers a number of topics in his 'Intuitions, Intuitionism, and Moral Judgment'. Most importantly, he extends his theory in two ways. Showing once again his willingness to incorporate other theories into his own, Audi addresses a theory of intuitions which rivals his. His theory of intuitions has as a requirement that the subject believe the proposition being intuited. A strong rival theory, held by different intuitionists and other philosophers, is that intuitions are seemings, or intellectual appearances, and that one need not believe p to have an intuition that p. Audi acknowledges these points and agrees that they can provide evidential ground for belief. However, he continues to reserve the term 'intuition' for beliefs meeting his conditions, and he accommodates the entities favored by rival views, designating them as 'intuitive seemings' or 'non-doxastic intuitions' (177). So once again, Audi opts for an inclusive rather than an exclusionary strategy in building his intuitionism.

The inclusion of 'fittingness relations' is an extension of larger proportions. H. A. Prichard and W. D. Ross put the moral relations in particular situations at the center of their wrong-making accounts. They stated that such relations exist, without explaining them. It seems that Audi's fittingness relations are entities of a similar sort. Consider a case in which we have made a promise to a person A to do x. When we contemplate whether we should do x, fittingness relations come into play as follows: 'we apprehend a relation of support between . . . the envisaged instance of promising and the envisaged act of doing the promised deed' (182). It seems that we do, in fact, do this. The question, then, will have to do with what these relations are, and what epistemic access we have to them. 'Apprehension' will appear to many to be too strong a term to describe a possible cognitive state in a particular moral situation, one bordering on the Prichardesque. And real moral relations, if that is what is involved here, will strike many as being too metaphysically cumbersome, although I believe their reemergence necessary for a complete intuitionism.

On the critical side, Sinnott-Armstrong offers a new empirically-based critique of intuitionism in 'An Empirical Challenge to Moral Intuitionism'. To his credit, he walks back some of the stronger claims he made in a similar vein previously. In this essay, over four pages, Sinnott-Armstrong carefully lays out an eleven premise argument having the conclusion that 'moral intuitionism is false' (25) The crucial empirically-based premise in the argument is: 'Informed adults are justified in believing that a large percentage of moral beliefs are not true' (22). And how is this supported? Studies have shown that such factors as partiality, emotions, order of presentation, wording, and sleep deprivation can have an impact on test subjects' moral beliefs (15-16).

The main question is, why think that this undermines intuitionism? Generally, intuitionist epistemology makes two kinds of claims: one about principles, the other about particular moral situations. While intuitionists disagree about what the moral principles are, it is widely agreed that there are a number of them, that they are self-evidently true, and that they are prima facie. Where particular moral situations are involved, intuitionists claim everything from no knowledge, which is Ross's position, to fallible knowledge, which is Audi's view. Either way, where particular moral knowledge is concerned, no intuitionist will dispute that psychological factors will have an impact on our judgments. Where self-evident principles, such as 'Keeping promises is prima facie required' and 'Harming others is prima facie wrong', are concerned, it is not clear that any empirical studies have directly tested subjects' beliefs about them. Do sleep deprived subjects suddenly think that harming others is permissible? Do emotional subjects think it permissible to break promises? Until we have the empirical studies that test actual intuitionist principles we won't know. Sinnott-Armstrong does agree with intuitionists that belief in obvious similar principles is justified (25), but claims that the important question is 'whether it is justified in the strong non-inferential way' that he defines (ibid.). It seems then that the success of his argument hinges on whether his 'strong way' of being non-inferentially justified in moral beliefs best fits intuitionist epistemology.

Crisp's 'Reasonable Disagreement: Sidgwick's Principle and Audi's Intuitionism' offers a version of the argument from disagreement against intuitionism. What he calls 'Sidgwick's Principle' is: 'A person who judges that p, if she finds that some other person judges that not-p, and if she has no reason to believe that other person to be in a worse epistemic situation than her, should suspend judgment on p' (152). So what puts you and another person on equal epistemic footing? For one thing, the two of you should be 'epistemic peers': 'you take her to be as likely as you to be right about the case at hand' (Ibid). In addition, the two of you should be in similar epistemic circumstances. The moral case in which Crisp puts Audi's intuitionism to the test involves two academic peers, both well trained, both with impressive publication records, considering two moral principles: the humanity formula of the Categorical Imperative and the principle of utility. It turns out they disagree. According to Sidgwick's Principle, the person holding the humanity formula should suspend judgment on it.

A little reflection on the case Crisp offers reminds us of what put the intuitionists in business in the first place. Prichard and Ross contrasted judgments an agent in an actual moral situation might make, such as 'I must keep the promise I made' with 'I must maximize the good,' the result being that the former is epistemically preferable to the latter. The 'plain man' is the person philosophers should aspire to become epistemic peers with, by testing our principles in the similar epistemic circumstances of actual moral situations. True, Crisp's target is Audi's intuitionism, and Audi does give the humanity formulation of the Categorical Imperative a prominent position in his Kantian intuitionism. But a part of Audi's program that Crisp does not address involves the inquiry between the Kantian principle and the Rossian principles, to see if, and the extent to which, they support each other. Granted, Crisp does get around to addressing the Rossian promise principle (165). But he says there is reasonable disagreement about it. So, once again, the discussion would profit from an empirical study of whether or not people actually think keeping promises is required. Even if some people disagree that we are prima facie required to keep our promises, it's unclear what would make such a stance reasonable.

The past decade and a half has seen the establishment of intuitionist foundations. Audi's work has been at the center of discussion. Although there is overlap in the systems of Audi, Russ Shafer-Landau, and Michael Huemer, there are critical points of difference as well. If the essays in this volume are any indication, it seems that we have moved into an expansionist phase in intuitionism. Before long, it seems, we will not be asking whether intuitionism is a possible theoretical option, but rather asking which intuitionist view best fits what we really think about morality. Overall, this is an instructive collection. It moves the discussion of intuitionism forward on several fronts. In reading it, I was made aware several times of good points I had not previously encountered.