The New Materialism: Althusser, Badiou, and Žižek

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Geoff Pfeifer, The New Materialism: Althusser, Badiou, and Žižek, Routledge, 2015, 140pp., $145.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138812086.

Reviewed by Knox Peden, Australian National University


The last decade has seen renewed interest in Althusser. For years, many presumed his structuralist approach to Marx had been eclipsed by the shift to poststructuralism in the Anglophone reception of French thought. But eclipses are transient by definition, and with the recent upsurge of interest in Marxism it stands to reason that Althusser's work should receive another hearing. The outpour of previously unpublished texts from his posthumous corpus has also shed new light on his canonical efforts of the 1960s and 70s. Arguably most important has been the interest garnered by contemporary philosophers who are explicit about acknowledging their debt to the Althusserian project. Here the main figures are Alain Badiou and Slavoj Žižek. Both have acquired an audience by attacking many of the pieties of poststructuralism and cultural studies, arguing instead for a radical politics grounded in universal principles of justice and historical action. Here Lenin and Mao serve as points of reference, which adds a certain frisson to their efforts that works for or against them depending on their audience.

As a member of the French Communist Party throughout his adult life, Althusser had kind words for these figures as well. On the one hand, Badiou's and Žižek's filiation with Althusser is a means of maintaining a commitment to the communist project, historically conceived. On the other, the patrimony is a matter of theory, and in particular Althusser's reconfiguration of Marxism as a theory of structural determination in which individuals serve as the bearers of competing and often contradictory forces. Althusser's theory of ideology -- as that which "interpellates" individuals as subjects within meaningful discursive frames -- is a consequence of his structural view of history. Badiou and Žižek have sought to maintain Althusser's insistence on the determinant weight of historical necessity while seeking to recapture a theory of subjectivity that allows for purposive action. In Althusser's view, structures produce subjects in the very act by which they produce themselves. The post-Althusserian task is to take this theoretical figure of mutual constitution and to figure out how subjects can in turn ground new structures, new vectors of determination in the political world.

Geoff Pfeifer's book is an attempt to present this genealogical situation in a succinct and compelling manner. Pfeifer's central claim is that Badiou and Žižek are best read as inheritors of the Althusserian project, which in essence was defined by the attempt to move past a stagnant oppositional conception of idealism and materialism. In addition to Feuerbach, whom he accused of simply inverting Hegel's idealism, Marx famously derided "vulgar" materialism of the Kraft und Stoff variety, which reproduced idealist forms of determination by locating them in matter itself. For Marx, materialism was a matter of practice and transformation. From thesis eleven to the labor theory of value this is a resonant theme throughout Marx's writings. In Althusser's view, twentieth-century Marxism in its practical forms, i.e. the Soviet Union and its allied parties, had succumbed to an idealist temptation by reading history as the necessary expression of human essence. In Stalin's conception of dialectical materialism, the political task was to see to the unmitigated expression of human essence in productive labor. This was the substance of Soviet economism. With the end of the Stalin regime in the late 1950s and the new vernacular of Marxist humanism within the Soviet Union and without, many saw a break with such a historical picture. Althusser saw continuity. Humanism was but economism by another name, a vision of history as the expression of an antecedent and valorized human essence.

To combat this view, Althusser constructed a remarkable theoretical edifice in which the structures that shape history do not coalesce around a single expressive contradiction but instead operate at a variety of incommensurable levels in order to sustain exploitative social relations. Historical change is not a matter of dialectical unfolding but "overdetermination," a term he borrowed from psychoanalysis. The levels of causality shaping any political instance are so multifarious that they are only intelligible retrospectively. The philosopher and the historian can be counted on to provide such intelligibility. Meanwhile, the political task is to seize moments of overdetermination in which competing ideological worldviews and structural factors start to breakdown in order to undertake an emancipatory effort. Such was Lenin's role, on Althusser's reading, in 1917. By multiplying the structures in history, which nevertheless coalesce around the central concept of the mode of production, Althusser challenged monocausal accounts of political history in a salutary way. But his theory of structural causality made it incredibly difficult to understand how agents could effect change deliberately. Such seemed to be the price to pay for showing the theoretical incoherence of a bourgeois view of the subject as an autonomous agent.

Pfeifer refers at one point to Marx's truism that men make history but not in circumstances of their own choosing. The wonder is that he sees it as harboring some kind of profound truth, one which, if we could only understand it, would shed light on our political aims and methods. Four of the book's six chapters provide accounts of Badiou's and Žižek's efforts to grapple with this paradox, to reconcile structure ("circumstances") and subjects ("men"). Pfeifer's claim is that Badiou succumbs to an idealist formalism of his own. His theory of the "event" -- the breach through which the state of a given situation is at once revealed and reconfigured -- provides little clue how such events are to be managed, much less orchestrated. Here Žižek's theory of the act is preferable because it locates the transformation in the subject him- or herself. The subject bears the weight of the act, whereas Badiou's subjects are subjects insofar as they bear witness to the event and remain faithful to it.

Pfeifer's summaries of Badiou's and Žižek's positions are serviceable, but they are largely derivative of Adrian Johnston's work (generously cited throughout), as is the fundamental contrast that Pfeifer sees between them. The opening two chapters on Althusser are less illuminating. Pfeifer gestures toward Althusser's hostile attitude toward Zhdanovism -- the Soviet idea that there is a particular proletarian culture to be maintained and promoted -- but he does little to draw out its significance. The contextual outline of Althusser's early work is heavily reliant on William S. Lewis's fuller account. And it's not always clear what's motivating certain discussions. The most promising aspect of Pfeifer's approach is the significance he attributes to Durkheim's notions of the sacred and the profane for understanding the conflicting temporalities of change and stasis at work in the ideas of his three protagonists. But the recourse to Durkheim is sketchy at best, and no work is done to establish any actual genealogical links between Durkheimian sociology and this new materialism. Perhaps there aren't any, but then we're left with an idea of influence or conceptual similarity so broad and generic as to be of little interpretative help.

Althusser, Badiou, and Žižek are all thinkers who repay reading and, in the first two instances at least, are worthy of serious exegetical attention. But they are ill served by a book that is impressionistic in its approach and that makes their ideas seem trivial at best. Compounding matters is the difficulty one has navigating the author's prose, which is maddeningly digressive. Pfeifer indulges the Žižekian tick of beginning an inordinate number of sentences with the imperative to "recall" a point previously made. Aside from being repetitive, this rhetoric also gives one the sense that an argument isn't so much being made as a premise is being reiterated. Beyond that, nearly every page is marred by a typo, errant punctuation, or an ungrammatical phrase, sometimes all at once. For example: "Further, it is out of this the Marx himself experiences the 'new' -- it is the scientific practice that Marx engages in that partially produces -- or reproduces, Marx's world" (28). Here blame goes as much if not more to the publisher than to the author. It says something about the state of academic publishing that such an ungainly manuscript would go to print in this form, to be offered for sale to libraries and sent out to journals for review.

Such infelicities would be forgivable were there a compelling position being staked out. Readers seeking an account of the new materialism will be disappointed to find that there is no engagement with the Anglophone work inspired by Deleuze or Latour that has sought to lock down this brand name. It is of course fine for Pfeifer to partition his approach and focus on what Althusser meant by materialism and its legacy. But this is never really elaborated in a satisfactory way. The discussion turns variously on the relationship between necessity and contingency, science and ideology, stasis and change, and structure and subject. Hegel and Lacan are frequently invoked as dialectical salves to these tensions. The elusive goal is apparently to alight on a "proper" materialism. But it turns out that to be a proper materialism is to be a non-reductive materialism (93). The book's opening discussion of Marx is meant to authorize this description, but the claim is plainly question-begging. Many materialists would counter that a proper materialism is one that seeks to be reductive, one that is able to explain certain epiphenomena in light of more fundamental causal processes. If we already know what a proper materialism is or would be, what use is there in arguing for it? Wouldn't we just accept that worldview and allow it to authorize our actions and inquiries as we see fit?

Althusser, Badiou, and Žižek are all philosophers. But they are ideologues too, and that in a non- or not wholly pejorative sense. A political vision motivates their philosophical work. But to tarry with them philosophically is to take on the dilemma bequeathed by the very idea of Marxist philosophy. It is to understand the provocation involved in Althusser's appeals to science or Badiou's to truth, terms that are often innocuous in other philosophical contexts but that are given an enigmatic valence in their work. It is not enough to be inspired by these authors, or alternatively appalled by them. And if readers are looking to be motivated in such ways, they have the original texts themselves. Philosophical scholarship on these thinkers should be of a different order, tracking their claims and seeing if they hang together and how well. Geoff Pfeifer's book demurs from such a task. Its evaluative criteria seem oriented more by preference than plausibility.