The New Mechanical Philosophy

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Stuart Glennan, The New Mechanical Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2017, 266pp., $40.00, ISBN 9780198779711.

Reviewed by Thomas W. Polger, University of Cincinnati


Minimal mechanism holds that "a mechanism for a phenomenon consists of entities (or parts) whose activities and interactions are organized so as to be responsible for the phenomenon" (17). Stuart Glennan argues that minimal mechanism characterizes what is common ground among various of the recent mechanistic views of scientific ontology and scientific explanation (cf. Bechtel and Richardson 1993; Glennan 1996; Machamer, Darden, and Craver 2000.)

According to this "New Mechanical Philosophy" or (more commonly) "New Mechanism", the discovery of mechanisms is an important objective of many sciences, especially but not only the life and cognitive sciences. Moreover, mechanistic explanation is an important and distinctive variety of explanation that had been previously neglected by philosophers of science. In many parts of philosophy of science, the introduction of mechanistic thinking has been groundbreaking. One can scarcely read an article in philosophy of biology, philosophy of neuroscience, or philosophy of the cognitive sciences without encountering discussion of mechanisms or mechanistic explanation.

The Big Deal about mechanisms, which Glennan discusses only briefly (7-8 and §2.6) but demonstrates at length, is that the New Mechanical Philosophy is the culmination (or at least a big step forward) of the trend away from thinking about science and scientific explanation in terms of laws and theories and toward thinking of them in terms of mechanisms and models. Just think about how deeply ingrained in philosophy is the old way of thinking about science and scientific explanation in terms of laws. Think about debates over whether biology is a science if it doesn't have laws. Think about the questions of whether there are psychological laws, and therefore whether there can be mental causation. Think about debates about reduction and emergence. Free will. Perception and reliability. Evidence. Natural kinds. Grue. Many issues in philosophy have been framed in terms of laws of nature. Despite the fact that problems with the best-known nomological (i.e., law-based) theories of explanation have been widely known since the 1950s -- and that the existence of even approximate laws outside physics has itself been subject to controversy -- many philosophers continued to frame myriad issues within and beyond the philosophy of science in terms of laws. One reason, I suggest, was the simple lack of a viable alternative. The New Mechanical Philosophy finally seems to provide a way to think and talk about science and scientific explanation that does not make central use of laws or law statements. Thus, the Big Deal about mechanism is that it promises solutions to some thorny philosophical problems and an opportunity to entirely reimagine many others.

Glennan's book is an ideal place to start your investigation of the New Mechanism. It has a bit of something for everyone. For those not at all familiar with the New Mechanism, the opening chapter situates this movement vis-à-vis recent trends in philosophy of science. The second chapter presents the basic ontological picture that Glennan argues other New Mechanists ought to share with him: phenomena, entities, activities, events, organization, systems, processes, dependence relations. It's not clear that all New Mechanists would embrace all of this ontology. But Glennan convincingly argues that the New Mechanists' ontology is not an austere one.

Next Glennan examines the other key pillar of his New Mechanism, the idea that models are "the central vehicles for representing the world and its causal structure" (59). This chapter is a terrific primer on the core idea of scientific models. Especially useful but also controversial is Glennan's discussion of abstraction and idealization, where he argues that "models are always partial and incomplete, and accordingly a realistic account of explanatory norms should seek to understand how partial and incomplete models can explain, rather than treating them as imperfect approximations of an ideal model" (83). This view is familiar, but it is also one that raises questions. For example, later in the book Glennan endorses David Kaplan's (2011) mechanism-model-mapping constraint (3M) on mechanistic models, according to which a mechanistic model is explanatory to the extent that its components map onto the real components of the target system and the dependencies in the model correspond to real dependencies in the target system (228). But once one has endorsed (3M), it's hard to resist the inference that more mappings always make for better -- what Mazviita Chirimuuta calls the More Details Better (MDB) principle (2014). Glennan wishes to accept (3M) but reject (MDB), but that means we need a reason to think that some models with fewer mappings -- due to abstraction or idealization -- could be at least acceptable and possibly even preferable for the purposes of explanation. (Not just for the purposes of quick calculation, or other pragmatic virtues.) Glennan says this is the case: "Abstraction and idealization are not just epistemic concessions; they allow us to separate principal from secondary causes within mechanisms and they allow us to achieve generality in our representations" (229). Yet I think many readers would like to hear more about how this could be the case given the New Mechanists' commitments. In particular, does the New Mechanism have its own distinctive argument for explanatory pluralism, or does it borrow from others (cf. Craver and Kaplan 2018)?

Up to this point, Glennan is mainly in the business of introducing the central ideas behind mechanistic philosophy, and describing various commitments that are widely if not universally shared by New Mechanists, but the fourth chapter diverges. Glennan's "models-first strategy" is stronger than one might have expected, holding "that entities are of the same kind when the same model can be used to represent them" (88). He argues that this account can be used to sort mechanisms according to the kinds of phenomena they produce, the kinds of entities they are constituted by, the kinds of activities and interactions that constitute them or that they perform, the kinds of organization they have, and the kinds of etiology that produce them, among others. Many of Glennan's distinctions correspond to those of other New Mechanists; but I am not aware of anywhere else in the literature that the connection to natural kinds has been made so explicitly and deliberately. Here again we get a sense of one of Glennan's missions that is less widely shared by other mechanists: he aims to be rigorous about the metaphysics of mechanisms. For example, Machamer, Darden, and Craver (2000) were specific about their "dualist" ontology of entities and activities; but pressed on the natures of entities or activities, they had little more to say. Glennan, in contrast, aims to be quite diligent in giving a full ontology of mechanisms and their components; hence this laudable discussion of kinds and the individuation conditions of mechanisms. At the same time, I think that many metaphysicians or metaphysicians of science will think that Glennan's mechanism would be better grounded in their own favorite ontologies, so I expect we'll see quite a few new papers proposing such revisions.

Next Glennan uses his distinctions to provide a huge catalog of mechanism types or kinds. Even those of us who have been in the trenches in the mechanism wars will be surprised at the sheer number of kinds of mechanisms that his system differentiates. Here I focus on one dimension of variation that distinguishes Glennan's view. He allows that the phenomena that mechanisms explain could be "one-off", "same-system recurrent", or "cross-system recurrent". As he says, "Within the recent philosophical literature on mechanisms, the phenomena that are typically discussed are recurrent phenomena. . . But minimal mechanism allows for mechanisms to be responsible for phenomena that do not recur" (110). This is one of the two most distinctive aspects of his view, and is closely related to the other that will be discussed below. Most mechanists distinguish mechanisms from other causal arrangements precisely because mechanisms are recurrent or regular. Glennan's minimal mechanism, by not requiring recurrence or regularity in mechanisms, must countenance many more mechanisms (and kinds of mechanisms) than those views that require regularity for mechanisms. They will also have quite different ideas about what counts as organization in a mechanism. It seems as though any arrangement of entities and activities -- however temporary or coincidental -- would count as a mechanism on Glennan's view, provided that it produces a phenomenon on some occasion. There must be, for example, mechanisms for producing typos, mechanisms for low probability events, and mechanisms for car accidents.

Although Glennan doesn't dwell on the fact that his account admits one-off mechanisms, it is important to keep in mind. This is one of the two big differences between his view and those of most other New Mechanists. The second big difference is his approach to causation, which he elaborates in chapters six and seven. Most theories of mechanisms presuppose some account of causation or causal explanation, whereas Glennan uses mechanisms to explain causation:

What is the relationship between mechanisms and causation? Put briefly, it is just that causes and effects must be connected by mechanisms. If one event causes a second, there exists a mechanism by which the first event contributes to the production of the second (145).

Now we see why Glennan needs to allow for one-off mechanisms. If every cause is connected to its effect by a mechanism, and if there are some causal chains that occur only once, then there must be one-off mechanisms. The existence of one-off mechanisms is required by his mechanistic theory of causation.

Once we learn Glennan's view that mechanisms explain causation rather than vice versa, we see that some of the preceding comity among New Mechanists is not what it seemed. Glennan's minimal mechanism says that entities and activities are "responsible for the phenomenon" and Machamer, Darden, and Craver say that entities and activities "are productive of regular changes." But Machamer, Darden, and Craver's talk of "production" is best thought of as causal. In contrast, Glennan's mechanism components, viz., activities, are "responsible" for the phenomenon and even "produce" it, but that is not (yet) causal responsibility or production. Glennan articulates and defends his mechanistic theory of causation in chapters 6 and 7. These two chapters will be of use to anyone interested in causation, whether or not they are interested in mechanisms. In fact, most New Mechanists are happy to take causation as a primitive. On the other hand, many readers will suspect that Glennan's mechanistic theory of causation smuggles in causal notions, after all. He is sensitive to this charge that his account is not just non-reductive but problematically circular (185). And he argues that there is no regress because the productive capacities of the whole mechanism are derivative of the productive capacities of its parts, but those are different productive relations so there is no regress. Yet the real worry is not that his account of complex mechanistic production presupposes mechanistic causation at the same "level", but that it presupposes causal relations somewhere on which mechanistic production depends (cf. Felline 2016).

Glennan's response to this kind of concern is the point at which many readers will opt out. "Perhaps," he writes:

there are basic causal interactions that can serve as a base case upon which productive causal relations may depend, but there may be other options. Perhaps, for instance, there is no end to the nesting, and there are mechanisms "all the way down." (185)

So, one way that Glennan's account could avoid presupposing a causal notion is if there is no fundamental causal "level" on which others depend, so the notion of production never has to be discharged, as it were. I don't know whether it is any more likely that the world is mechanisms all the way down than that it is turtles all the way down. But it strikes me as risky to rest our theory of causation on the chance that it can push its responsibilities down the road infinitely.

The other way that Glennan's account could avoid presupposing a causal notion would be if there is a fundamental causal relation, but it is itself mechanistic: "If there were fundamental mechanisms in the sense defined, then events in which a change to one entity produces a change to another via that fundamental mechanism would be related as cause and effect" (186). In this case there is a truly minimal kind of mechanism in which a fundamental c produces a fundamental e, and that would be the fundamental causal mechanism. Glennan agrees that "the productive capacities of wholes derive from the productive capacities of parts" (184), and he describes three general patterns by which complex productive relations are "compounded from productive relationships" that are less complex or more basic: constitutive production, precipitating production, and chained production (179). But what is the basic kind of productivity? And where does it come from?

If production were, say, mark transmission, or the exchange of conserved quantities, or some such, then we would be able to reductively explain causation in this way. But Glennan aims at a non-reductive account, and he denies that production can be reduced in this way:

There is on this view no one thing which is interacting or causing, and when we characterize something as a cause, we are not attributing to it a particular role in a particular relation, but only saying that there is some productive mechanism, consisting of a variety of concrete activities and interactions among entities (148).

Causation is production, and production is heterogeneous. But a small sample of the productive relations that Glennan recognizes are touching, lacerating, migrating, multiplying by mitosis, triggering, dropping, failing, and dying (59). These are all activities, and according to him, it is essential to activities that they produce change (171). Yet change-making is what we think about when we think about causation, especially in the difference-making views of causation. To this reader the phenomena of causation and production are too similar to allow us to elucidate one in terms of the other.

There is much more to be said about Glennan's mechanistic theory of causation. It will be fertile ground for further discussions of causation. Though these two chapters on mechanistic causation and causal production are absolutely central to his project, I'm afraid that they may be neglected by those whose primary interest is in mechanisms and mechanistic explanation more generally. It's not clear that they need this mechanistic theory of causation. In a footnote, Glennan cites Carl Craver as one advocate of mechanism who has explicitly rejected the mechanistic account of causation on offer here (145). Readers might be led to think that Craver is an outlier among the New Mechanical Philosophers; but it is Glennan whose view is more idiosyncratic, and I would say that the most important aspects of the New Mechanical Philosophy that were developed in the preceding chapters do not depend on the success of Glennan's mechanistic account of causation.

Finally, we come to Glennan's views on explanation, which will have a broad appeal. Contrary to the views (or at least rhetoric) of some New Mechanists, Glennan does not argue that all explanation is causal explanation. Instead he argues that the most important features of explanation are that it shows something about dependence relations and that it permits a kind of unification of models (212). But ultimately it is dependence that does the work. Because some dependence relations are not causal relations, some explanations are not causal explanations. Glennan distinguishes bare causal explanations, mechanistic explanations, and non-causal explanations (223-236). What he has to say here is common ground among New Mechanists, at least in broad strokes; of course, his version differs in some details. But this is not to say that his view is uncontroversial. In fact, his handling of some classic cases differs strikingly from, for example, Bradford Skow's (2016) discussion of some of the very same examples. I leave it as an exercise to the reader to compare their treatments of Sober's (1983) cases of equilibrium explanation, for example.

This is a rich book, very readable, and definitely recommended. Glennan downplays the differences between his theory and the other mainstream New Mechanists, and in doing so sets the stage for the next round of debates over the nature of mechanisms and mechanistic explanations. His mechanistic theory of causation is not likely to win over many adherents; but though that may disappoint him it is no defect in the book, for almost everything else he says stands up very well without that account of causation. Indeed, this will very likely be the go-to book for advanced undergraduate and graduate courses about mechanism and mechanistic explanation for the foreseeable future.


 Thank you to Stuart Glennan, Alex Huffman, and Larry Shapiro for useful comments on an earlier draft of this review.


Bechtel, W. and R. Richardson. 1993. Discovering Complexity. Princeton University Press.

Chirimuuta, M. 2014. Minimal Models and Canonical Neural Computations: The Distinctness of Computational Explanation in Neuroscience. Synthese 191 (2): 127-153.

Craver, C. and D. Kaplan. 2018. Are More Details Better? On the Norms of Completeness for Mechanistic Explanations. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science. online first.

Felline, L. 2016. Mechanistic causality and the Bottoming-out problem. In L. Felline, A. Edda, F. Paoli, and E. Rossanese (eds), New Directions in Logic and the Philosophy of Science (College Publications.)

Glennan, S. 1996. Mechanisms and the Nature of Causation. Erkenntnis: 49-71.

Kaplan, D. 2011. Explanation and Description in Computational Neuroscience. Synthese 183 (3): 339-373.

Machamer, P, L. Darden, and C. Craver. 2000. Thinking About Mechanisms. Philosophy of Science 67 (1):1-25.

Skow, B. 2016. Reasons Why. Oxford University Press.

Sober, E. 1983. Equilibrium Explanation. Philosophical Studies: 201-210.