The New Philosophy of Criminal Law

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Chad Flanders and Zachary Hoskins (eds.), The New Philosophy of Criminal Law, Rowman and Littlefield, 2016, 276pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781783484140.

Reviewed by Larry Alexander, University of San Diego School of Law


This is an aggravating book. Its title suggests why a journal dedicated to reviewing philosophical books would commission a review of it. But the title is quite misleading in that respect. The "the" in the title suggests something singular rather than what the book delivers: thirteen different essays, each by a different author, and most on discrete topics quite unconnected to each other. The "new" in the title surely oversells. The essays are all original, but their topics are long-debated ones. And finally, "philosophy" implies that the essays will be philosophical in nature -- that is, analyzing concepts or presenting normative arguments derived from normative first principles, and engaging with contrary philosophical views of like nature. Some of the essays conform to this description of philosophical work, but some do not.

Why then do Chad Flanders and Zachary Hoskins call this anthology "the new philosophy"? In their introduction, they say the philosophy of criminal law is dealing with problems that it traditionally did not deal with, and so, they argue, it should change. And, they say, it has changed in three ways: It "is becoming more holistic, more critical, and more interdisciplinary." It is (or should be) more holistic in that it should take into account all aspects of the criminal justice system and ask, not whether a particular crime or the punishment attached to it is justified, but whether the entire criminal justice system is justified. It is (or should be) more critical by asking whether the traditional categories of criminal law are justified. And it is (or should be) more interdisciplinary by considering not just legal philosophy, or moral philosophy, or political philosophy, but all of these.

I must say that to the extent I agree with the editors about how the philosophy of criminal law should be conducted, I find nothing new in their prescriptions. Those doing philosophy of criminal law have for a long time been critical and interdisciplinary and to some extent holistic -- although holism carried to the level the editors seem to envision is likely to introduce too much nonphilosophical "noise" into the philosophy. Bentham exemplified all the traits of "the new philosophy" in the nineteenth century, as did (and do) Joel Feinberg and Michael Moore much more recently.

Flanders and Hoskins appear to believe that phenomena such as overcriminalization and mass incarceration are new and warrant methodological revision. But philosophers of criminal law have been grappling for some time with the questions of what conduct merits criminalization, how crimes should be individuated, and how the proper goals of punishment, such as incarceration, should be weighed vis-à-vis their various costs.

So I am unpersuaded that there is a "new philosophy of criminal law," much less that this anthology embodies it. Let me then comment briefly on some of the specific contributions to the anthology.

Part I is titled "Crime and the Function of Criminal Law," and the three contributors are Vincent Chiao, Joshua Kleinfeld, and Stuart P. Green. Chiao and Kleinfeld give somewhat opposing accounts of criminal law's function. For Chiao, it is not, as the retributivists would claim, the means by which moral wrongdoers get their just comeuppance -- what Chiao calls the private right model of criminal law. Chiao argues instead that criminal law is just part of a public regulatory system, a part that regulates through the threat of harsh sanctions. On this public law model, there is, argues Chiao, "no philosophically interesting distinction between criminal justice (or 'theories of punishment') and distributive justice (or 'theories of equality')." And although Chiao disclaims any assertion of the superiority of either model, his sympathies clearly lie with the latter.

The problem with Chiao's public law model is that it severs any link between punishment and desert. It treats punishment like any other device to prevent rule violations. An electrified fence, a moat with crocodiles, and a safe that can only blasted open by a would-be thief prepared to die in the process are all equally effective measures to prevent rule violations. On Chiao's account, criminal punishment seems to belong to that family of protective devices, devices that show no concern for the desert of those who suffer as a result of their transgressions.

Kleinfeld's position is quite different from Chiao's. For Kleinfeld, criminal law and punishment are meant to affirm a community's norms in the face of those whose behavior sends a message of disdain for those norms. Kleinfeld injects a heavy dose of Hegel and Durkheim into his theory and comes up with a position not all that different from that of Patrick Devlin in his famous exchange with H. L. A. Hart over homosexuality. Community solidarity is the overarching value that crime and punishment are meant to vindicate.

Like Chiao's position, Kleinfeld's seems overly demoralized, or if moralized, then much too relativist. Of course a society's list of crimes and punishment will be a reflection of that society's norms. But that sociological point seems inadequate as a philosophy of criminal law.

The last piece in this part is by Green and is on sexual offenses. Green has some interesting things to say about them, but the piece seems oddly specific in a section on the function of the criminal law in a book on the philosophy of criminal law.

Part II, "Authority and Legitimacy", contains contributions by Alice Ristroph, Douglas Husak, and Jovana Davidovic. Ristroph argues that punishment, to be legitimate, must be imposed by a state that is legitimate, for conduct that is properly criminalized, through procedures and policing that are legitimate, and proportionate both with respect to desert and to punishment's collateral damage. I agree with Ristroph's conditions, though I suspect she and I will differ on their applications.

Husak's contribution is an extended meditation on who has authority to punish and for what. He points out that many people and institutions have the authority to inflict certain kinds of sanctions for certain kinds of misbehavior. A babysitter may have the authority, delegated by the parents, to punish misbehaving children in certain ways -- say, by sending them to their rooms. The NCAA can punish athletes and coaches for certain kinds of misconduct. So, Husak asks, just what kinds of punishment, and for what kinds of misconduct, are reserved to the state? His answer is the state may punish, and only punish, public wrongs -- wrongs that concern the whole community -- and wrongs for which the state has a substantial interest in proscribing. But in that respect, the state is no different from other punishers, who can punish wrongs against them. Husak rejects the legal moralism of Michael Moore and the duty view of Victor Tadros, both of whom assume a general duty to punish, a duty Husak denies exists. On the other hand, he also denies that only states may punish criminals no matter the circumstances. There is much food for thought in Husak's contribution.

If Husak is considering punishments inflicted within a state but not by a state, Jovana Davidovic is considering punishment beyond the state -- international criminal law. Her focus is the permission of international tribunals and states to punish for certain wrongs wherever committed. Ultimately, she comes down in favor of universal jurisdiction to punish violations that are crimes against the international community and the international rule of law. Her chapter and Husak's seem to me to be complementary, as both endorse non-state punishment.

Space constraints require me to be even briefer in my discussion of the remaining contributions. Part III, "Offenders and Victims," contains a chapter by Arlie Loughnan that views criminal responsibility through a socio-historical lens rather than through a legal-philosophical one. That makes the chapter a rather odd one for inclusion in an anthology that purports to be philosophical.

The other chapter in Part Three, by Sandra Marshall, focuses not on the offender but on the victim. She argues that if the criminal law is the law of our political community, then we all have a role to play in it not only as witnesses or jurors, but also as victims. The latter have a duty to report the crimes against them and to give evidence in the trials of those crimes -- duties owed to the polity of which they are a part and the values of which the crimes transgress.

Part IV, "Criminal Procedure," has a chapter by Richard L. Lippke on plea bargaining and a chapter by R. A. Duff on presumptions of innocence. Lippke lists several problems he and others find in the U.S. practice of plea bargaining. He then proposes some measures to deal with those problems. His chapter is very much a policy paper rather than a philosophical one.

Duff's chapter interrogates the meaning of the presumption of innocence. He considers both narrow meanings (merely referring to the standard of proof required for a criminal conviction) and wider ones (referring to how the state and others should regard its citizens). Duff argues, for example, that citizens should treat those acquitted of criminal charges as if they are actually innocent of those charges, even though many are in fact guilty. He says that this does not require belief in their innocence, but only that the acquitted be outwardly treated as citizens in good standing. Duff also notes that civil suits may establish that those acquitted of crimes most likely committed them -- as did, for example, the wrongful death suit brought against O. J. Simpson. Duff does not, as far as I can see, harmonize his assertion that we must treat persons acquitted of trial as if they are innocent with the fact that civil suits may establish their guilt as more probable than not. (Must we treat O. J. as if he is innocent of the double homicide in the face of the civil suit verdict that he committed it?) As usual, Duff is provocative in this chapter, even if not totally convincing.

The final Part, "Sanctions," contains chapters by Christopher Bennett, Mary Sigler, and Zachary Hoskins. Bennett argues that criminal punishment should be thought of as an apology ritual. That is, punishment should be what the offender would go through were he properly apologetic. He parts company with retributivists not because the apology ritual will not cause the offender to suffer but because the suffering is incidental to-- rather than the point of -- punishment, as it is for retributivists. (I am not convinced that Bennett's position is as different from the retributivist's as he believes.)

Sigler deals with the distinction between equity and mercy in criminal punishment. Mercy is at odds with the criminal's desert, but equity counsels adjustments in punishment to accord with desert.

Hoskins deals with the collateral consequences of criminal convictions rather than the punishment for the crime. As one of a multitude of examples, an attorney convicted of a serious crime may have his license to practice law revoked. Such collateral consequences are not typically regarded as punishments because their purposes are not the suffering of the offender but the protection of the public. They, of course, overlap with criminal punishments to the extent the latter take the form of restraints such as imprisonment that also serve to protect the public during their duration. Put differently, collateral consequences of the civil disability variety (like the disbarment of convicted attorneys) function much like preventive detention. Hoskins asserts -- and I agree -- that preventive detention is not punishment. Thus, neither are collateral consequences that are preventive in nature punishment.

In sum, there are many chapters in this anthology that are worth a read. But despite the title, do not expect "the new philosophy of criminal law."