The New Politics of Materialism: History, Philosophy, Science

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Sarah Ellenzweig and John H. Zammito (eds.), The New Politics of Materialism: History, Philosophy, Science, Routledge, 2017, 328pp., $140 (hbk), ISBN 9781138240742.

Reviewed by John Protevi, Louisiana State University


Sarah Ellenzweig and John H. Zammito have edited a challenging set of essays that can serve as a critical companion to the “new materialist” (NM) movement, the main exemplars of which here are Diana Coole and Samantha Frost, Karen Barad, Jane Bennett, Elizabeth Grosz, Luciana Parisi, Jussi Parikka, and Rosi Braidotti. Many essays also mention Gilles Deleuze as an influence on NM, and a few concentrate on him as a NM thinker (Ansell-Pearson, Lowrie, Hayles).

The Introduction sets out three critical themes by means of which the essays interrogate NM: history, ontology, and politics. The extension of the term “materialism” is at stake in all these themes: is it purely a metaphysical stance, one opposed to dualism, or does it also cover any concept of matter as active or passive, etc., with no regard to metaphysics? On the former, restrictive sense, we can say that the physicalist Hobbes is a “materialist,” but not the dualist Descartes, no matter what we might say about his view of matter. Ontologically, we might ask if “materialism” points to any notion of matter as input to production process at any scale (e.g., recruits are the matter from which soldiers are produced) or is it only matter as endpoint of reduction (i.e., “small stuff treated by sub-atomic physics”) to which other regimes are reduced? Finally, intersecting these questions are the onto-political senses of “materialism” as the primacy of the economic, the rejection of a spiritualist notion of mind or soul, and a purely instrumental view of the effects of public religion.

The question about history: has NM staked its claim to novelty for its notions of active matter and widespread non-human agency by constructing a straw man out of the “old” materialism of Early Modern Europe, one supposedly dedicated to the thesis of inert, dead, or passive matter to be studied by mechanistic physics? About ontology: are NM thinkers too profligate in their ontology by attributing agency when mere causal efficacy would suffice? Do they properly account for “scale variance” or differences in power at different levels of emergence? And about politics: can the NM thinkers ground a politics in a new materialism of widespread agency, or do they lack the grappling with a naturalized normativity that would be needed for such political interventions?

Accompanying all these questions is another that appears from time to time (in the essays of Jess Keiser, Keith Ansell-Pearson, Angela Willey, and Christian J. Emden), and is the focus of Zammito’s contribution: wouldn’t it be better to analyze concepts of nature and naturalism than those of matter and materialism?

Ellenzweig starts off by claiming that Coole and Frost’s invocation of a “Cartesian-Newtonian” concept of matter as “inert” (in the popular sense of passivity, rather than the scientific sense of persistence in motion or rest without external influence) is not supportable when subjected to a fine-grained historical analysis. For Ellenzweig, such a notion derives more from one-sided readings by anxious theological critics rather than from the eponymous thinkers, whose works were more ambiguous when it came to the active / passive distinction. Descartes’s physics, with its plenum (refusal to separate space from matter), and the way in which matter maintained motion granted it originally by God was read by idealist contemporaries as granting too much activity to matter and hence threatening the spiritual impetus for motion that they believed necessary. For Ellenzweig it was thus critics of Descartes who insisted on the dichotomy between dead matter and activating spirit; Descartes’s own concept of matter was more ambiguous or even paradoxical in combining activity and passivity. Ellenzweig also claims that Newton’s notion in the first edition of the Principia of a vis insita or “innate force” that amounts to a vis inertiae or “force of inactivity,” amounts to a similar paradox or at least ambiguity between matter as active and passive; Newton will switch to a more passive notion of matter in the second edition of the Principia, after the enthusiastic John Toland had taken up the active matter interpretation and run with it. Anxious about a theological reaction similar to the one Descartes got, Newton then took pains to deaden his notion of matter. Ellenzweig then provides a nod to Spinoza’s conatus, which can now be seen as hearkening back to the active interpretation of matter in Descartes and Newton, before ending with a reading of Lucretius as advocating a limited notion of material dynamism, since too much attribution of activity or life to matter tempts one to animism and away from scientific naturalistic explanation.

Continuing the historical theme, Charles Wolfe explores the 18th century tradition of vital materialism, focusing on La Mettrie and Diderot. He avoids a universal dynamic matter however, which he sees as the mere counterpart of Engels’s concept of “mechanistic materialism,” a concept he finds echoed in NM. For Wolfe, most 17th century mechanists were substance dualists or agnostics rather than materialists. Wolfe will instead draw our attention to the 18th century vital materialists’ concern with embodiment; what La Mettrie attempts is a soul-to-living-body reduction, not a mind-to-matter reduction. For Wolfe, this avoids a notion of body as dead matter animated by a vital principle, and a notion of living or vital matter below the organizational level of bodies. In other words, for his vital materialists, it’s organisms that are alive, and not simply “matter” as the “stuff of the universe.” Wolfe finds a fine statement of organic living emergence in one of his vital materialists: “For Venel, organic molecules and organized bodies are subject to laws that are different from that of matter in motion” (46). After his sketch of vital materialism, Wolfe turns to a criticism of the focus on subjectivity in the enactivist school exemplified by Evan Thompson, which strikes him as dualistic. He concludes with a look at Barad, whom he absolves of a subjectivity focus, but whose notion of materiality doesn’t connect with the biomedical analyses and reductionism of the vital materialists, hence preserving them as resources to be recommended to the current scene.

Wilson and Zammito, however, think Ellenzweig goes too far in purging Descartes of a concept of inert matter (Ellenzweig does admit it’s ambiguous). They emphasize that Hobbes at least was a straightforward mechanistic physicalist, as admitted by both Ellenzweig and Wolfe, so that for Wilson and Zammito “new materialism” is not forging its “old materialist” opponent out of whole cloth. Hence for Zammito, the 18th Century vital materialists were reacting against 17th century mechanists, which include Descartes and Newton. Also, he reminds us, let’s not forget late 18th century Laplacean eliminativist, physicalist, determinism.

While allowing NM some historical accuracy with regard to its relation to “old” materialism (qua concept of matter, rather than metaphysical position), Wilson goes on to criticize the NM writers for a tendency to “declare, rather than to argue for, an intrinsic connection between the metaphysics of self-organization, indeterminate spontaneity, and progressive moral thinking on animal welfare, global inequality, gender, and climate change” (114). If we are to argue politics, Wilson says, we should recognize that Early Modern European materialists were seen as “the party of humanity,” and had the kind of theocratic enemies of which progressive thinkers should be proud. More mildly put, the is-ought distinction and its accompanying human exceptionalism has been the defensive position of contemporary critics of materialism; to illustrate this, Wilson examines the 1998 dialogue of Jean-Pierre Changeux and Paul Ricouer. Wilson admits that full-blown normativity, truth, and so on, are resistant to full naturalization, but she approves nonetheless of Changeux’s claim that the sciences can help us with new understandings of human nature. Consider, for example, Wilson asks us, psychological findings that “reveal an underlying disposition to sympathetic identification with others as a powerful human trait” (122). This enables us to question the Kantian move to a noumenal source of the moral will:

Rather than interpreting these conflicting results regarding altruism and selfishness in Kantian terms as the operations, now of a supernatural, now of a natural, element within us respectively, the scientific approach asks us to investigate the co-existence of these two sets of ‘natural’ motivation, as elicited by different cues in the context in which they are experienced (122).

Wilson then poses a very nice question: might it be that the counterpart to NM is not “old materialism” but science-resistant humanities (125)? But not just any science: at the end of the day, Wilson implies, it’s not in the vast sweep of materialist ontology that one should look for help in the battleground of politics, but in the materialist aspect of the biological and human sciences (which themselves are sites of contestation between, for instance, many Evolutionary Psychologists and many feminists).

In an essay with historical, ontological, and normative implications, Jess Keiser proposes a plastic conception of matter as escaping the binary of dead, passive matter and lively, active matter and allowing us to instead investigate the relation of " ‘first nature’ (understood as biophysical matter) and ‘second nature’ (understood as the ‘normative’ realm of discursive practices, social codes, and cultural rituals)" (68). Focusing on the neurophysiological, Keiser seeks to establish two early modern thinkers, Descartes and David Hartley, as possessing a plastic conception of brain matter, and thus resonating with William James and Donald Hebb’s theories. Shifting then to a contemporary, Keiser presents a brisk overview of the work of Adrian Johnston on first and second nature, that is, the way in which nature produces that which ruptures it, exceeds it, and conflicts with it. Johnston’s complex and challenging work resists short summary, but suffice it to say that for Keiser, Johnston enables us to grapple with the problem of how to “somehow reconcile a seeming dualism (between matter and mind, nature and culture) with the demands of monism” (70).

Keith Ansell-Pearson tackles the ontological and the normative aspects of NM in his Deleuze-centered essay. He begins by distinguishing naturalism (as denying human exceptionalism) and materialism (for him, physicalism). He insists that a strong strand of the early Deleuze is that of a “ethically minded naturalist” (92) echoing Lucretius, Spinoza, and Nietzsche in the fight against superstition and the search for human action as norm-generating. A turn to the work of Elizabeth Grosz allows Ansell-Pearson to distinguish a politics of subjective recognition and a politics grappling with the natural and social forces generating subjects with the power to affect and be affected. After a further treatment in detail of the Deleuze-Spinoza-Lucretius nexus, Ansell-Pearson concludes that Deleuze’s naturalism does not “deprive the human animal of its ethico-normative distinctiveness” (106). Hence for Ansell-Pearson, we should read Deleuze as a naturalist, and hence against human exceptionalism, but not as “anti-humanist” if that means denying the distinctiveness of the human; humans are part of nature, but an odd part, if you will.

Lenny Moss’s essay engages both the ontological and the normative. Against what he sees as a too loose notion of agency in new materialism, Moss distinguishes agency from activity by mobilizing a Hegelian insight: naturalized agency appears with taking a position in a normative field, one with values relative to and important for an agent. Moss brings together Aristotle’s flourishing and the Kantian/Hegelian notion of autonomy in his theory of natural “detachment”: “Detachment theory holds that ‘nature explores greater levels of detachment’ and that at increasingly higher levels of detachment this increasingly amounts to moving toward the capacity for normative self-determination” (237). Moss digs deeper than the usual attribution of value to single-celled organisms (“sense-making” in the enactive school) to discuss water, proteins, and enzymes; he finds there a “leap into a new space of self-organizing possibilities and thus a gateway into the possibility of normative causation” (239). Dipping below the biological like this is a bold move by Moss, especially in an essay that goes on to criticize Deleuze for “blurring life/non-life distinctions” (242) and Barad for a scale-free move of seeing quantum effects in the human register, but his insistence on a definite theory of normative agency arguably licenses his gesture.

Angela Willey is another of the contributors who foregrounds “nature” rather than simply “matter.” Feminist theories of the relation of nature and culture posed by Donna Haraway, Karen Barad, Sherry Ortner, Gayle Rubin, Catherine MacKinnon, and Judith Butler can help us escape a stale notion of NM as humanist appropriation of already-formed scientific findings about “vital matter.” Instead, we should be focusing on the way NM “insists upon the inseparability of ontology and epistemology, being and knowing, nature and culture” (149). By doing so we open ourselves to a “capacious call for creative and reflexive reimaging of the meaning of meaning making” so that we can “reconsider the stakes of knowledge politics to include the very materialization of bodies and worlds” (149). In this way, Willey sees one of the strongest potentials of NM to be its capacity to challenge disciplinary boundaries and allow us to marshal “proliferating narrative resources for knowing our worlds, and, in turn, making them anew” (150).

The questions of reduction and emergence come most clearly into focus in Derek Woods’ essay on “scale variance.” For Woods, this notion calls into question Barad’s position that quantum effects ramify in the macrophysical register. Referring to Mariam Thalos (2013), Woods calls into question the unity of science model of reductionism to physics. Alongside his critical remarks on Barad, Woods tackles DeLanda’s reading of Deleuze in Intensive Science and Virtual Philosophy (DeLanda 2002). I think there are some problems with his presentation of DeLanda, in which Woods assimilates the fully differentiated virtual to relatively undifferentiated pre-individual ontogenetic fields of individuation such as the egg. Nonetheless, once we leave ontogenesis, Woods poses important questions to DeLanda about the flat ontology of formed individuals and their part-whole relations at different scales.

N. Katherine Hayles picks up on the scale theme in her essay on the “cognitive nonconscious,” which she defines in terms of sub-personal neural processes of synthesizing, filtering, inferring, and anticipating which underlie conscious experience. The “cognitive nonconscious” differentiates levels of natural agency and thus “bridge[s] the gap between quantum effects and cultural dynamics,” a bridge whose mechanisms Barad and other NM thinkers assume must exist but do not explicitly discuss (185). Hayles attributes some of the level-skipping to a Deleuzean influence on NM. However, while it may be true that some NM thinkers (Hayles discusses Parisi, Parikka, Grosz, and Braidotti) emphasize the decentering and centrifugal terms of Deleuze (“deterritorialization” and “destratification”), Hayles neglects the way in which, in A Thousand Plateaus at least, Deleuze and Guattari insist upon the way in which centripetal forces of organismic organization (aka, “reterritorialization” or “stratification”) are both necessary and in many cases salutary. “Staying stratified . . . is not the worst thing that can happen” they say (Deleuze and Guattari 1987, 161). Despite these quibbles, Hayles’s essay is a formidable challenge to her post-humanist NM interlocutors to fill in some of the mechanisms subtending the forms of cognition displayed in the natural continuum in which humans fit.

A third essay discussing scale is that of Christian J. Emden, who claims that NM is “self-defeating” (271) if it thinks it can forego an account of naturalizing normativity that, instead, can be found at the intersection of philosophical naturalism and political theory. For Emden, ethical and epistemic norms are not different in kind, but both inhere in the way in which humans cannot easily escape causal networks. Furthermore, Emden adds, we are owed an account of the emergence of normativity in material conditions, and because we “already live in a normative world,” that account should show how the political and ethical worlds engage with the material (273). Emden’s positive move is to naturalize humans by an account of the “emergence of normativity, linked to an uneven ontology of different scales of what we regard as reality” (273). After a treatment of Bennett, Braidotti, and Barad that accuses them of the naturalistic fallacy in one form or another, Emden shows that too oftrn philosophical naturalism and mainstream political theory avoid the naturalistic fallacy at the cost of an unacceptable divorce of the normative and the natural. Including nonhuman actants in the context of politics is acceptable to Emden, but only on the condition that we have an “uneven ontological field” with “complex forms of differentiation” (287). Emden thus closes with a sketch of three “scales of normativity” that impose constraints on different sets of agents: the biological and physical scale shared by all organisms; the affective scale relevant for “higher order animals, including humans”; and  “moral and epistemic norms” and their social institutions, which govern “responsibilities, duties, and obligations” which are “qualitatively unique to human animals” (288-289).

Ian Lowrie will try to make consistent three tenets of his theory of social reality: Durkheim’s notion that social phenomena are objective; Deleuze and Guattari’s notion that the systematic nature of social phenomena are amenable to “a logic of tracing and coding”; and the notion that social phenomena are ordered by the historical and material conditions of their development (155). Objecting to the tendency in some NM thinkers to treat society as yet another assemblage aside others, Lowrie pivots to a discussion of Durkheim’s realist ontology of social systems impinging on the psychic systems of individual inhabitants. Lowrie’s take on Durkheim however insists on keeping contact with a historical materialist perspective linking the social to material practices. This brings him to Deleuze and Guattari, whose thought on the socius or organizing system of material and semiotic “flows” is summarized quite nicely as well as usefully put into relation with contemporary anthropological studies of non-state societies. Lowrie finishes with a challenging reading of contemporary financial capital against that of Deleuze and Guattari in Anti-Oedipus, whom he thinks neglect the still operative coding operations of capital in favor of its schizophrenizing powers, such that desiring machines break free of the socius qua inert recording surface. While that’s plausible as a critique of Anti-Oedipus, I’m not convinced of Lowrie’s charge that A Thousand Plateaus falls prey to “nostalgia of the pure, for unorganized desire” (172). Despite my demurral here, Lowrie’s essay provides the framework of a re-reading of Deleuze and Guattari that will ultimately be fruitful in confirming or nuancing their work.

Mogens Lærke combines historical and political foci. Joining NM in not being satisfied with social constructivism, Lærke warns that materialism may not be the best way to avoid it, insofar as Hobbes, in his radical arbitrariness of signs and contractualist politics, is something of a social constructivist. Earlier in the volume, Wilson had shown that one can’t necessarily pin a regressive politics on “old” materialism, as it was seen at the time as the “party of humanity” against theocrats. Lærke, however, will claim that no politics can be grounded in materialism, though a Spinozist naturalization of politics, grounding it in the power relations of people and sovereign, can provide some hope, as long as we recognize the need to read Spinoza as “a genuine middle ground between materialism and idealism” (262).

We’ve treated some of Zammito’s historical interventions above; let me conclude by turning to his “Concluding (Irenic) Postscript,” where he asks for shift from the “new materialism” framework to that of “complex naturalism” allowing for the emergence of human subjectivity (308-309). Zammito’s call for attention to emergent order in nature brings to mind self-organizing systems (organismic, ecological, social) as the unit of study more than entities emerging from material configurations. The recommended shift from matter to nature works, I think, because we have such an atomic (in the literal and figurative senses) view of “matter” that reductionism and individualism go together. In this picture, the aggregation of individual capacities is always a threat to reduce emergence (that is, seeing emergence as merely epistemological and hence able to be reduced in a future with more exact measurement capacities). Of course, it’s in the question of measurement where quantum uncertainty comes in and why Barad is such an important figure in this collection. Beyond that, the move to a nature in which one can discern complex systems promises to be one that would allow the full fruit of Deleuze and Guattari’s work to be appreciated, as both a member of, and an inspiration to, the new materialist movement.


DeLanda, Manuel, 2002. Intensive Science and Virtual Philosophy. Continuum.

Deleuze, Gilles and Félix Guattari, 1987. A Thousand Plateaus. Translated by Brian Massumi. University of Minnesota Press.

Thalos, Mariam, 2013. Without Hierarchy: The Scale Freedom of the Universe. Oxford University Press.