The New Pragmatism

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Alan Malachowski, The New Pragmatism, Acumen, 2010, 161pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773537019.

Reviewed by Elizabeth A. Sperry, William Jewell College



Alan Malachowski’s The New Pragmatism accomplishes its central goal, which is to introduce non-specialists to the work of Rorty, Putnam, and their forebears Peirce, James, and Dewey. Malachowski nicely explains the main connections and points of difference between these figures, as well as how their work has been received. Philosophers who lack detailed knowledge of pragmatism could do worse than to begin with this relatively slim volume, which reads quickly, neither bogging down under a load of technicalities nor over-simplifying the issues.

Malachowski urges adoption of the term “The New Pragmatism” (apparently coined by Cheryl Misak) to describe the work of Putnam, Rorty, and their philosophical co-workers, because, he says, the “neo” in neo-pragmatism implies inferiority to classical pragmatism. Rorty sometimes called himself a neo-pragmatist, so presumably the rhetorical concern is not universal. Regardless, Malachowski treats Putnam, Rorty, and the classical pragmatists with equal respect, which is not always the case in this philosophical arena. Quite often scholars attached to Dewey are dismissive of Rorty, or those impressed by Putnam have little time for James (this despite the fact that Rorty wrote admiringly of Dewey, as did Putnam of James). Malachowski’s unabashedly pro-pragmatist stance enables him to analyze each figure’s strengths and weaknesses charitably, and to explain how less-than-nuanced criticisms — for instance, those lobbed by Russell against James — have been readily accepted in some philosophical circles.

Fittingly, Malachowski roots his précis of the new pragmatism in classical pragmatism. James famously considers a squirrel spiraling around a tree in order to avoid being seen by a man who is also spiraling around the tree. The question is: Does the man go around the squirrel, or only around the tree? James answers that it depends upon what we mean, in practical terms, by “going around the squirrel.” Answering the question in metaphysical terms causes greater intellectual problems than it solves (e.g, what is the intrinsic nature of “going around”?), while the difficulty is dispatched easily if we focus instead on the practical consequences of various possible interpretations. Contemporary pragmatists are similarly concerned with the practical consequences of our beliefs, and similarly opposed to attaching themselves in advance to any intellectual methodology. Pragmatism, whether old or new, can seem intellectually squishy precisely because of its refusal to issue a philosophical ukase, but its strength lies in this very flexibility. Rather than maim the world into suitable shape for a Procrustean metaphysics, pragmatism works to handle the world and human experience in ways that produce the best long-term results.

Malachowski also considers the relationship between contemporary pragmatism and contemporary philosophy, in both its continental and analytic variants. Continental philosophers often find pragmatism too much like analytic philosophy, and analytic philosophers sometimes dismiss pragmatism in the same terms used to deride continental philosophy. Contemporary pragmatism occupies a middle place, making use of elements from both analytic and continental philosophy, while aligning itself fully with neither. Postmodern philosophy provides one important example of this larger pattern. For instance, both postmodernism and contemporary pragmatism eschew transcendental arguments and essentialism, but pragmatists retain a more positive attitude than do postmoderns toward science, the Enlightenment, and the possibility that our beliefs might (non-metaphysically) relate to the real world.

Malachowski presents the original pragmatist triumvirate - Peirce, James, and Dewey - before showcasing Rorty and Putnam. Charles Peirce founded pragmatism, and his approach reflected his scientific and mathematical background. William James popularized Peirce’s ideas, or something like Peirce’s ideas, given James’ markedly more humanistic orientation. (The difference, as is well known, led Peirce to retitle his account “”SpellE">pragmaticism," a term he deemed “ugly enough to be safe from kidnappers.”) Russell and Moore attacked James’ conception of truth, and Malachowski makes a good case that these criticisms were based on misinterpretation. Dewey emphasized the need for philosophy to reflect human concerns and to work to ameliorate human problems. While he agreed broadly with Peirce that science was an important center of inquiry, he also agreed with James that philosophy errs when it abstracts from actual human interactions with the world.

Malachowski spends a significant portion of this book examining the development of Rorty’s career. Rorty at first looked to be a party-line analytic philosopher, then evolved into a critic of analytic philosophy, and ultimately settled on pragmatism. Yet Malachowski shows how Rorty’s transformations are less dramatic than they appear, and how his later commitments are already prefigured in his early work. Malachowski also provides an overview of critical reaction to Rorty’s texts, including the objection that Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature doesn’t argue against its conceptual targets so much as it considers them historically contingent and hence disposable. That same emphasis on contingency is present in Rorty’s later full-blown (neo-)pragmatism, but now contingency is an ineliminable part of everything we value, rather than a rationale for discarding old ideas. Our language, our communities, our selves — all are contingently generated; nevertheless, we are committed to all three and to our conceptions of them because they enable us to make sense of our experience. Throughout, as Malachowski notes, Rorty presents his views without arguing for them straightforwardly, but instead by showing how we might learn to see them as attractive and useful. In other words, Rorty justified pragmatism pragmatically. He also showed that he had learned the principle James failed to observe: do not engage your opponents on their own conceptual turf, unless you wish to be defined in alien and inhospitable terms.

Putnam, Malachowski notes, has had a career “much more conventional than ”SpellE">Rorty’s. As a result, his views have not been inordinately clouded or distorted by the fog of public notoriety" (61). Putnam’s more cautious appropriation of pragmatism has made him more congenial to analytic philosophers, but also less inclined to pursue his pragmatist tendencies to their ultimate implications. Nevertheless, Putnam has urged such pragmatist attitudes as opposition to the notion of a knowable mind-independent world and a repudiation of the fact-value distinction. He has also made clear his debt to classical pragmatism, particularly that of James and Dewey; elaborated on the pragmatism implicit in work by Quine and Davidson (as did Rorty); and devoted considerable thought (as did Dewey and Rorty) to democracy’s importance for enabling people to understand one another, and thereby to help solve one another’s problems.

For roughly thirty years, Malachowski points out, Rorty and Putnam explored the same terrain, yet were unable to reach philosophical accord. As Malachowski shows, these seemingly intractable differences resulted more from opposed intellectual styles than from opposed viewpoints. Rorty was happy to be affiliated with pragmatist ideas; Putnam remained skeptical. The former explored pragmatism’s possibilities while the latter tended to test them. Ultimately both approaches have their strengths. Putnam’s more tentative tone, for instance, made it possible for philosophers otherwise leery of pragmatism to consider its merits.

Malachowski rounds out his discussion by showing contemporary pragmatism’s usefulness in other areas of study. For literature, pragmatism demonstrates that inquiry need not be scientific to have merit. Literature not only is a distinctive means of exploring the human experience, it also helps readers to understand the circumstances of the oppressed and can thus drive social change. In the legal arena, pragmatism tries to obtain the best results for an actual community, rather than leaving the law entrenched in abstract principles that may serve few human interests. With respect to feminist theory, pragmatism can orient discussion toward improving the situation of women and away from unproductive conceptual debates. In education, pragmatism encourages schools to teach skills of open-minded inquiry and social cooperation. And so on.

Malachowski’s overview efficiently surveys the relevant ground and closes with a bibliographical essay for those who want guidance on how to proceed further. Even for those who have already proceeded further, Malachowski’s coverage may provide occasional new insights concerning the connections between the five major figures mentioned here and their reception in the philosophical community. Three minor problems should be borne in mind, however. First, although Malachowski mentions pragmatism’s meliorism, it deserves an even heavier emphasis. Pragmatism’s optimistic contention that humans can improve their situation and their knowledge is, for instance, one of the central features differentiating it from postmodernism, but Malachowski does not mention this. Second, even though this book is an introduction, the reader would benefit from a more complete exposure to some of the concerns sympathetic critics have raised against pragmatism. For example, Rorty sometimes appears naïve about the way in which social structuring affects our ability to differentiate real usefulness from what we have learned to perceive as useful. Finally, Malachowski’s insistence on the term “The New Pragmatism” may be rhetorically off-putting to some readers, particularly given that it was not used by either of the two notable “new pragmatists.” Malachowski is devoted enough to the title that he forgets to consider the semantic sensitivities of his subjects. Rorty used “neo-pragmatism” without apparent concern that he would thereby generate a philosophical inferiority complex. But Malachowski writes,

The New Pragmatism no longer needs to keep reminding itself that it is a form of ‘pragmatism’; it can just get on with the job of exploring issues of interest. It is for this reason that … Rorty often wrote extensively without pausing to explicitly invoke the name of the New Pragmatism. (58)

Perhaps, but it is dangerous work to speculate on the motives behind another person’s linguistic choices. The term does not please my ear, but for all that it may render unforgettable the title of this well-executed book.