The New Religious Intolerance: Overcoming the Politics of Fear in an Anxious Age

Placeholder book cover

Martha Nussbaum, The New Religious Intolerance: Overcoming the Politics of Fear in an Anxious Age, Harvard University Press, 2012, 285pp., $26.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674065901.

Reviewed by Colleen Murphy, University of Illinois, Urbana-Champaign


Martha Nussbaum's The New Religious Intolerance: Overcoming the Politics of Fear in an Anxious Age grew out of a column that she contributed to "The Stone" in the New York Times about proposed burqa bans in Europe, in which she detailed her opposition to such bans. The resulting comments from readers led Nussbaum to write a reply in "The Stone" and, eventually, a book on the topic of religious freedom. Nussbaum's task is to understand the nature of the fear based on religion with which so many communities continue to grapple, and to articulate the moral principles and practices we should use to evaluate this fear and the actions it motivates. The New Religious Intolerance is an excellent book. Written for a general audience, it is accessible, at points humorous and entertaining, yet also passionately and seriously addresses a topic of central importance to many communities today. Nussbaum provides a reflective and compelling account of the standard that should be followed by communities to guarantee the equal treatment of and respect for members of all religions, and an account of the social conditions needed for that standard to be followed in practice. She also demonstrates the impact that philosophy can have on pressing policy and political debates, engaging actual arguments advanced in support of competing positions in the public domain and subjecting them to critical scrutiny.

Nussbaum's book begins with the claim that "ugly fears and suspicions . . . currently disfigure all Western societies" (p. 2). She focuses specifically on the United States and Europe and concentrates on fear based on religion, especially toward Muslims. In chapter 1 Nussbaum provides an overview of various laws that target Muslims and Islam -- for example, prohibiting the wearing of the burqa by women or barring courts from appealing to Sharia law -- as well as actions taken by citizens and companies, such as Disney telling employees to take off or cover their headscarf. At the root of these laws and requirements, Nussbaum claims, is fear based on religion.

In chapter 2 Nussbaum turns to the nature of fear. Fear is what Nussbaum calls a primitive emotion, shared with other animals (unlike emotions like compassion) and directed toward our well-being and survival. Recognizing that the absence of fear is problematic (we become susceptible to potential serious harm), Nussbaum's main concern in this chapter is with how fear can become misdirected. Drawing on Aristotle and Mill, she argues that errors in fear arise when individuals have an inaccurate conception of well-being, are indifferent to the well-being of others or the community, or misjudge what actually threatens well-being properly understood.

Certain psychological tendencies exacerbate the propensity of individuals to err in these ways. We tend to overestimate the significance of clear problems (the "availability heuristic") and agree with what others think (the "cascade" effect). Moreover, we often suffer from what Nussbaum calls "projective disgust," taking certain groups to have an exaggerated degree of characteristics connected to our animal nature (such as being smelly or dirty). Thus "fear can produce unreliable and unpredictable conduct, and it can be exploited by politicians eager to whip up aggression against unpopular groups" (p. 20). These dangers surrounding fear are of particular concern in matters of religion, where history provides numerous examples of harm directed against religious minorities and justified by appeal to a real concern (e.g., security) that is improperly connected to that minority.

So how should we as individuals and communities deal with this kind of fear? First, Nussbaum suggests, we need to articulate general principles to guide us. This is the subject of chapter 3. Nussbaum assumes that "all humans have equal dignity" (p. 65), which we cannot lose or surrender. She then claims that governments should respect this dignity and that it is impermissible to violate it. A central component of dignity is conscience, the "faculty with which people search for life's ultimate meaning" (p. 65). Thus to violate the conscience of an individual is to violate their dignity. Our conscience can be violated by conditions in our community, for example when individuals cannot act on their convictions or are forced to affirm beliefs contrary to their convictions. To protect dignity, Nussbaum concludes, governments must protect freedom of belief and expression equally and widely. Of particular concern for Nussbaum is the protection of religious belief and expression.

What does protecting freedom of religious belief and expression entail? Nussbaum discusses two distinct ways that courts in the United States have interpreted this demand: the Lockean tradition and the accommodationist tradition. Both interpretations recognize that certain important public interests, such as safety, can ground limitations on expression. They also both recognize that individuals ought to enjoy equal rights, though they differ in their understanding of what that demands. Drawing on John Locke, the Lockean tradition requires "laws that do not penalize religious belief, and laws that are nondiscriminatory about practices, that is, the same laws must apply to all in matters touching on religious activities" (p. 71). For example, laws may not permit the teaching of Latin in schools, while prohibiting the use of Latin in churches. However, laws may impose unequal burdens on different religious groups, so individuals may be required to testify in court on a holy day and must be willing to accept a legal penalty if they follow their religious commitments and refuse to testify.

Drawing on Roger Williams, the accommodationist tradition is more demanding in its requirements. On this view, even when we do not intentionally persecute religious minorities or subject to them to discriminatory laws, we may nonetheless be treating them unfairly. For example, penalizing individuals for refusing to testify on a holy day penalizes them for being a minority; this is "a grave offense against equal respect for conscience" (p. 74). Equal rights require an accommodation for religious minorities in such cases, "otherwise the majority [is] claiming for itself a liberty much more extensive that it [is] prepared to grant to others" (p. 75). Nussbaum discusses the strengths and limitations of both standards, concluding that on balance she favors the accommodationist standard.

According to Nussbaum, to ensure that laws protecting religious freedom are actually interpreted and applied in a manner that protects all individuals, we need to cultivate impartiality and a sympathetic imagination. Chapter 4 addresses impartiality, the demand that we act on principles we would be willing to allow others to act on, an idea found in Kant and the Gospels. In Nussbaum's view, decisions are too often "distorted" by fear and bias, which make them inconsistent; minority groups are held to a standard to which the majority is not. To illustrate this inconsistency Nussbaum considers burqa bans, which have been adopted in Belgium, Italy, and France, and are supported in Spain, Holland, and Britain. The burqa fully covers women, leaving a mesh screen or a slit opening for the eyes (p. 247). Although seldom worn by observant Muslim women, those who wear it often claim to see it as religiously required. There are five arguments advanced in support of such a ban. After presenting each argument, Nussbaum discusses its inconsistent application.

According to the first argument, the security of a community is weakened when some members are not required to show their face in public. In response, Nussbaum notes the multiple occasions on which individuals cover their faces in public places without problem: during winter months, in many sports (e.g., football, skiing) and in occupational settings (e.g., surgeons and dentists). A second argument appeals to civic friendship, claiming that this friendship is undermined when individuals cannot interact in a face-to-face manner. In reply, Nussbaum highlights that we do not worry about civic friendship when individuals wear sunglasses, and contends that this argument does not recognize the adaptability of persons to deal and communicate with those thought at one time to be odd (e.g., those who are blind).

The third argument objects to the burqa because it "is a sign of male domination that symbolizes the objectification of women" (p. 114) and promotes the treatment of women as mere objects. In response, Nussbaum writes that "modern societies are suffused with symbols of male supremacy that treat women as objects" (p. 115), including tight jeans, high heels, plastic surgery, and revealing clothing. Just as we don't think it appropriate to subject these modes of dressing to legal ban out of respect for the autonomy of women though we might not approve of them, so too we should think it inappropriate to ban the burqa though we might not approve of it. The fourth argument claims that women wearing the burqa are forced to do so, especially in cases of young girls. Nussbaum finds this argument implausible when generally stated without knowledge of the particular circumstances of specific women. The issue of girls being coerced to wear the burqa is complicated, though Nussbaum points out the myriad ways that parents coerce children to wear respectable clothing and to date respectable people, which we don't find objectionable. Intervention in the case of children is justified in cases of abuse or where a practice may impair a major functioning. However, that standard is not satisfied in the case of the burqa. The fifth argument is an argument regarding health, which claims the burqa is uncomfortable and dangerous for women to wear. Here Nussbaum asks the reader to imagine what it would be like to ban all uncomfortable clothing (e.g., high heels). Assuming that we would reject such bans, Nussbaum argues that consistency dictates we refrain from banning the burqa too.

Ensuring religious freedom in practice requires more than good principles and a commitment to constancy. It also depends on the sympathetic imagination of members of a political community, as Nussbaum argues in chapter 5. Sympathetic imagination involves empathy (the ability to understand the situation of another), as well as a capacity for caring, so that we use our empathetic understanding to further and not to undermine the well-being of another. Care needs to be directed not just toward those who are like ourselves, but toward those with whom we interact. In the context of religious freedom the sympathetic imagination is important because it puts us in a better position to understand how a given law may affect the members of different religious communities, and in particular whether it will put an undue burden on them. Nussbaum argues at length that literature, and in particular children's literature, has an important role to play in the cultivation of the sympathetic imagination.

Chapter 6 considers the case of Park 51, and the proposed "Islamic-initiated multifaith community center, containing a prayer space" and residing near "ground zero" (p. 188). Nussbaum applauds the widespread recognition of the constitutional right to establish this center. The main subject of debate in the United States is the ethical question of whether this center should be built near ground zero. Nussbaum discusses the ways in which the preparation and presentation of the case for the center were flawed, but ultimately concludes that such a center is permissible. Chapter 7 consists of a brief conclusion.

Nussbaum convincingly pleads for Americans and Europeans to adopt more nuanced views and attitudes toward Islam and Muslims, recognizing, for example, the different strands of thought within Islam. As a side note, I was puzzled and somewhat disappointed by her much more sweeping generalizations about Europe. Nussbaum contrasts Europe and the United States in broad terms, attributing to Europe an approach to religious minorities that is uniform and wanting in comparison with the United States because it fails to sufficiently entrench the rights associated with freedom of belief and expression: "The specific principles I advocate are, historically, more American than European. Europeans share some of the key premises (ideas of human dignity and equality), but on the whole they have not been as eager as Americans to develop legal regimes that insist on fairness to minorities . . . it is by now clear that the European solution is no longer adequate" (p. 61). Moreover, she frames the challenges facing Europe as uniform in important respects. At one point Nussbaum does acknowledge that Europe is a continent of enormous diversity and that the challenges facing individual countries are distinct. It would have strengthened her analysis to have this diversity illustrated, and the implications for the contrast she is drawing with the United States articulated.

Nussbaum is concerned with reaching a general audience, engaging in the political discourse surrounding religion, especially Islam, in the United States, and influencing how we think about and deal with religious difference. Given this objective, it was also surprising that she is not a particularly strong advocate for the accommodationist standard she on balance favors, nor does she provide guidance for how its limitations might be addressed. Passions and fears are often evoked and expressed around particular issues (such as the headscarf, burqa, or the building of mosques), not abstract principles. Thus what communities urgently need if they are to deal with fear are not just general principles, but more specific guidelines and standards for dealing with religion in a principled manner. It is precisely this guidance that the Lockean and accomodationist standards provide.

While Nussbaum correctly notes that both standards share the same underlying commitments and lie on a continuum, they can have very different implications for the lives of religious minorities in terms of the ways in which religious commitments that conflict with majority norms will be treated. It therefore matters which standard communities adopt. Nussbaum seems satisfied with a situation in which both standards are viable.  However, allowing both standards can lead to unfairness, since claims that may be granted under one standard but rejected under another are left to chance in terms of the state in which they are pressed and the judge to which they are appealed. For example, the request for an exemption to a requirement to testify on a holy day may be granted by one judge, but would have been denied by another. Whether or not an individual faces legal penalty for following her convictions in refusing to testify would, in this case, be a matter of luck.

These concerns should not detract from the virtues of Nussbaum's account. Her account of the rights and social conditions needed to guarantee equal respect and religious freedom is persuasive, and her historical and literary examples illustrate abstract theoretical points and are often thought-provoking. For example, the extended discussion of the burqa forcefully draws the reader's attention to multiple practices that are taken for granted as normal and unproblematic, yet are analogous to practices that are viewed as objectionable. The New Religious Intolerance offers a powerful defense of the importance of religious liberty and a call for communities to cultivate the social conditions required to maintain this freedom and respect.