The New Wounded: From Neurosis to Brain Damage

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Catherine Malabou, The New Wounded: From Neurosis to Brain Damage, Steven Miller (trans.), Fordham University Press, 2012, 268pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780823239672.

Reviewed by Bryan Smyth, University of Memphis


Catherine Malabou's star has been steadily rising in the Anglophone world over the last several years. Numerous books have appeared in translation, including the re-readings of Hegel and Heidegger, and the materialist reorientation of Derridean deconstruction, that form the philosophical grounds of her subsequent research.[1] This research is concerned primarily with developing a theory of change as ontological metamorphosis, an aim Malabou pursues through a radicalized notion of plasticity -- the capacity to receive and give form -- that she has worked out through a critical encounter with contemporary neuroscience.[2] Drawing upon but also pushing beyond neuro­scientific uses of the term 'plasticity' to denote the flexible qualities of neuronal systems with regard to their genetic development, experiential modulation, and regenerative repair, Malabou is centrally interested in conceptualizing what she calls 'explosive plasticity'.[3] Based on what is, in effect, a neo-Hegelian dialectics of nature, the notion of explosive plasticity stems from the 'contradiction' that Malabou posits within the homeostatic functioning of the nervous system between maintenance and alteration, an ongoing tension that in her view drives the formation of the brain as a discontinuous process of creative self-generation, thereby introducing freedom into the neurological context.[4]

This radicalized sense of plasticity is the conceptual leitmotiv of Malabou's recent work, and it enables her to propose a staunchly materialist ontology without any deterministic implications. The idea of explosive plasticity blurs the line between the natural and the social, or between biology and history -- or more specifically, between neurology and psychology, between the brain and the psyche and their respective scientific discourses. Inasmuch as the brain is not merely the generic substrate of the psyche, then, neuronal plasticity is implicated in subjective life in a way that portends the transformation of necessity into freedom. The idea is that qua neuronal form, subjective identity is not a given essence that is merely flexible and which as such would persist unchanged across various elastic modifications, but is rather dynamically sculpted and re-sculpted through an on-going series of 'explosive' ruptures. On this basis, Malabou has made some intriguing suggestions about possible political implications of brain plasticity, in the sense that it could, at least in principle, be taken up within the scope of intentional agency directed toward historical change.[5]

This is an appealing and even auspicious project. But in positive terms it cannot go beyond the level of speculation. For the persuasiveness of the argument is limited by the effective impossibility of providing direct and unequivocal evidence of genuinely creative neuronal self-regeneration. That the latter occurs is entirely possible, of course, but no empirical evidence can be drawn from neuroscience, since this does not recognize the category of explosive plasticity. Much depends, then, on how Malabou accounts for this omission, which she does with an auxiliary argument to the effect that the conceptual horizons of contemporary neuroscience are constrained ideologically by the normalizing appropriation of its own brain metaphors -- especially the idea of 'flexibility' -- by the discourse of neo-liberal management.[6] This (unverifiable) claim may be right, but it is, to say the least, highly contentious, and it will strain the credence of those not otherwise predisposed to embrace the radical perspective Malabou proposes.

Potentially more persuasive, then, would be to adopt a more subdued approach to explosive plasticity by focusing, not on its creative potential, but rather on its possible harmful consequences. This is what Malabou undertakes in the present book (a translation of Les nouveaux blessés, 2007).  She explores what she calls 'destructive plasticity', a species of explosive plasticity that results in pathological cases of neuronal degeneration rather than regeneration.[7] These outcomes are not opposites, though, for both are matters of unprecedented metamorphosis, hence both involve destruction and creation. It's just that the formative power in cases of destructive plasticity entails a painful kind of alienation that would be absent from those cases in which a self-conscious identification with one's 'synaptic self' would entail a heightened autonomy. And it is this suffering that will provide more tangible evidence of the reality of explosive plasticity, thereby contributing to a greater awareness of the central role of the brain in psychic life.

Who, then, are 'the new wounded'? In the first place, they are those who have suffered psychic injury as a result of cerebral lesions, i.e., physical 'brain damage'. The classic case is that of Phineas Gage, a mid-nineteenth-century railway foreman who famously survived serious damage to his prefrontal cortex caused when an iron rail was blown through his head. Although Gage survived, he was no longer himself -- he literally 'became someone else' (53). Even if (as some suspect) there is more legend than fact in this story, it nonetheless dramatizes Malabou's idea of an explosive change in personal identity: psychic life continues after the injury, and not formlessly, but it does not have the same form as before, nor does its form bear any connection at all to what preceded it. In such cases, the injury gives rise to 'a new, unrecognizable person' (48), a person radically severed from her or his psychic history.

Malabou's claim is that this is due to the modification of the underlying structure of synaptic connectivity wherein that history subsists. That is, it's not that the modification entails a weakening or distortion, however acute, of the personality of the victim; rather, the modification amounts to the annihilation of that personality and the emergence of another through destructive plasticity. And Malabou thinks that this can occur in ways other than cerebral lesion, including neurodegenerative disorders such as Alzheimer's, and even what she calls 'sociopolitical trauma' (or 'war trauma'): experiences -- of torture, terror, or sexual assault, for example -- that involve 'extreme relational violence' (11). In fact, such cases, which Malabou thinks are increasingly common in the contemporary world, ultimately represent her chief interest.

Common to all cases of the new wounded is a 'radical rupture' in psychic life and the birth of an 'identity without precedent' -- a new identity which, moreover, is characterized by animpoverished and dysfunctional emotional life, including severe behavioral 'disaffection' and inter­subjective 'disaffiliation'. For Malabou, this symptomatic profile indicates a profound suffering constituted by an 'indifference to suffering' (xii), and it represents the crucial evidence of the new wounded. Such cases might be found throughout history, but what's supposed to be new about them pertains to their etiology and how this is conceived. Central to Malabou's account is the idea of the 'affective brain'. Drawing on the work of Antonio Damasio, Malabou contends that the brain's homeostatic regulation functions as an 'affective economy' based in a sui generis process of 'cerebral auto-affection', 'the brain's capacity to experience the altering character of contact with itself' (42): 'emotions organize and coordinate cerebral activity' in a way that points back to a 'pure vital emotion', the object of which is the 'cerebral self' (37f). 'Within the brain, therefore, there are no regulatory mechanisms for adaptation to the outside that do not entail the emotive adaptation of the inside to itself' (38). In other words, 'the brain affects itself -- that is, modifies itself -- within the constant flow of vital regulation' (42, emphasis added).

There is thus a dialectic of identity and otherness within the brain itself, and therein lies the vital contradictoriness of homeostasis: maintenance is the paradoxical product of 'cerebral auto-excitation', and the negativity of this dialectic is that of destructive plasticity. So while the processes of cerebral auto-affection are normally below the level of conscious experience, the event of their breakdown can lead to the affective disturbances manifestly suffered by the new wounded.

Extending the idea behind post-traumatic stress disorder, which introduced a new way of conceiving psychological conditions that had previously been misrecognized as kinds of neurosis, Malabou sees the cases at hand as involving psychic wounds that arise from neuronal reorganization set in motion by senseless traumatic events (149ff) -- whether organic lesion or social violence. Straddling the line between brain and psyche, these cases can no longer be understood in either neurological or psychiatric terms alone. Malabou thus proposes to bridge this divide with a more general 'neuropsychoanalytic' theory of trauma in terms of the explosive disruption and plastic reorganization of neuronal networks (154ff), claiming that in 'reopen[ing] the great question of the relation between biology and the social' (158), this perspective represents a new and more inclusive paradigm for contemporary psychopathology as a whole.

Such is, in brief outline, the content of Malabou's reflection on the new wounded. In itself, this might not require a book-length treatment. But Malabou is especially concerned with making clear that her vision of neuropsychoanalysis does not subsume neurology under psychoanalysis, or vice versa. Fundamentally, they are both faulty since neither recognizes explosive plasticity. This concept, which is Malabou's own, forms the real ground of the synthesis she proposes. So even while she favors neuroscience inasmuch as she endorses a 'naturalist philosophy of mind' (xii), for instance, the view of nature that is operative in this claim actually owes more to Freud.

The argumentative structure of the book is thus set up as a three-step dialectical 'confrontation' between Freudian psychoanalysis and contemporary neuroscience concerning their respective conceptions of psychopathological etiology: 'sexuality', and what Malabou calls 'cerebrality' -- by analogy with the former, this denotes the causal capacity of the form of neuronal connectivity 'to determine the course of psychic life' (2).

Malabou first develops a harsh critique of psychoanalysis from a neuroscientific perspective that mainly targets the claim of the indestructibility of the psyche and 'the persistence of the primitive'. Malabou identifies the underlying problem as an a priori commitment to hermeneutical meaning, for this forces all trauma into the model of neurosis. In causal terms, psychoanalysis can only regard exogenous events as triggering preexisting internal conflicts, which are the real determinants of pathology. It cannot admit the radical senselessness of the traumatic event, and thus it has nothing to say about those (i.e., the new wounded) who, as a result of trauma, are left without childhood traces or a psychic history at all.

But then Malabou turns the tables and develops an equipollent rejoinder. The idea here is that such cases cannot be understood as the result of an exogenous event without also postulating 'the existence of an internal, endogenous, process of destruction that responds to the traumatic stimulus and welcomes it, in a sense, facilitating its work of annihilation' (70). The objection is to neurological monism, and so Malabou emphasizes the etiological complexity of sexuality in terms of the 'dualism' of Freud's libido theory -- for Freud, 'sexuality always reveals the otherness of the sexual to itself' (102), such that 'the sexual etiology of a psychic disturbance must always begin by talking into account both pleasure and destruction' (105). Through an adroit reading of his corpus, Malabou argues that Freud was always committed, at least intrinsically, to the existence of an immanent 'death drive', such that one could parry the neurological critique of psychoanalysis and argue to the contrary that, with regard to psychopathology, it would make better explanatory sense to locate cerebrality within the dual structure of Freudian sexuality.

But on their own, neither of these approaches -- rejecting or prioritizing psychoanalysis -- is adequate. In the third stage of the discussion, then, Malabou explores 'whether the death drive and the brutal traumatic force of the event can be thought and articulated together' (166). Here is where Malabou's own vision of a neuropsychoanalysis emerges, but the emphasis is on how the elements need to be joined under the aegis of destructive plasticity -- Malabou is not concerned yet with trying to work out the therapeutic consequences of neuro­psycho­analysis, but simply with 'radicaliz[ing] our interrogation of destruction' (169).

For Malabou, coming to terms with destructive plasticity requires using the neurological critique to force a radical revision onto psychoanalysis by positing the existence of a death drive that would be independent of the pleasure principle: 'the death drive as the formation of death in life, the production of individual figures that exist only within the detachment of existence' (199). While this would be a matter of cerebrality, more importantly it would involve endogenous determination. In this way the psychoanalytic model holds the key to conceiving the metamorphic work of destructive plasticity. It may seem gloomy to admit that we are all vulnerable to becoming 'new wounded' (213). But if this is true for the reasons Malabou gives, then it could be taken as evincing the more general and potentially liberating sense of explosive plasticity.

On the whole Malabou's book is a fascinating attempt is extend the concerns of dialectical biology into the neurological realm, and to stake out the ground of a materialism that would pass between the Scylla and Charybdis of reductionism and anti-reductionism. The main issue that hangs over it, though, has to do with its relation to empirical science. On the one hand, the discussion of sociopolitical trauma is based on a plausible but nonetheless weak negative-symptomatic analogy with lesional and neurodegenerative cases. Even granting her claims with regard to the latter, then, it is dubious whether the psychically dehumanizing effects of contemporary forms of war can be chalked up en bloc to the same (or any) sort of brain plasticity, as if there is 'a [i.e., singular] post-traumatic condition that reigns everywhere today' (17, italics altered).

Yet on the other hand, Malabou's claims regarding lesional and neurodegenerative cases are themselves ultimately based on a speculative 'meta-neuro­biological' claim to the effect that 'the determination of psychic disturbances . . . is always contemporaneous with a certain state or a certain age of war' (xvi) -- a claim that warrants assuming that 'the behaviors of patients with war trauma . . . are comparable in every respect to those of patients with brain lesions' (xviii, italics added). It is thus only by granting priority to the broader 'geopolitical' picture that Malabou can validly affirm the categorical unity of the new wounded. It is clear enough why it would be desirable to do so: interpreted in terms of explosive plasticity, the sense of this senselessness would attest to the material reality of freedom without surrendering to the quietism of positive science. Articulating an account of the dialectical negativity of nature is an important philosophical task today. But more than a metascientific problem, this is ultimately a political issue. Attempts to deal with it will therefore inevitably be insufficient in empirical evidential terms. Malabou's effort in this book is impressive, and interested readers will profit from it. One should just remain mindful that for all the discussion of neuroscience, a necessary condition of accepting her account of explosive plasticity will be its alignment with one's own political commitments.

[1] Respectively, The Future of Hegel: Plasticity, Temporality, and Dialectic [1996], trans. Lisabeth During (Routledge, 2005)—reviewed by William Dudley in NDPR (2006.10.05); and The Heidegger Change: On the Fantastic in Philosophy [2004], trans. Peter Skafish (SUNY, 2011). See also Plasticity at the Dusk of Writing: Dialectic, Destruction, Deconstruction [2005], trans. Carolyn Shread (Columbia UP, 2010)—reviewed by John Protevi in NDPR (2010.02.22).

[2] La chambre du milieu: De Hegel aux neurosciences (Editions Hermann, 2009).

[3] Her terminological choice is related to the fact that, alongside other meanings, the French word plastique also means 'plastic explosive' (with the cognate verb plastiquer).

[4] See What Should We Do With Our Brain? [2004], trans. Sebastian Rand (Fordham UP, 2008)—reviewed by Pete Mandik in NDPR (2009.04.27).

[5] In general, see What Should We Do With Our Brain? With regard to feminist concerns, see also Changing Difference: The Feminine and the Question of Philosophy [2009], trans. Carolyn Shread (Polity, 2011).

[6] See What Should We Do With Our Brain?, in particular the third chapter.

[7] See also Ontology of the Accident: An Essay on Destructive Plasticity [2009], trans. Carolyn Shread (Polity, 2012).