The Non-Existence of the Real World

The Non Existence Of The Real World

Jan Westerhoff, The Non-Existence of the Real World, Oxford University Press, 2020, 341pp., $93.00 (hbk) ISBN 9780198847915.

Reviewed by Sean M. Smith, University of Hawai‘i at Mānoa


Jan Westerhoff’s most recent monograph is a densely argued and highly systematic attempt to undermine a number of realist convictions. In this book, we have four long chapters, each arguing for a brand of anti-realism beginning with the mind-independent external world (Ch.1), our introspective access to an inner world organized around a self with a continuous stream of conscious contents (Ch.2), ontological foundations (Ch.3), and fundamental truths (Ch.4). Each chapter is meticulously organized and full of arguments worthy of careful consideration.

Those familiar with Westerhoff’s work will be aware that he has made substantial contributions to our understanding of Indian Buddhism (Westerhoff 2018), especially Madhyamaka (Westerhoff 2009). This book is interesting in that its approach is clearly inspired by Westerhoff’s understanding of Madhyamaka Buddhism (which he interprets as a kind of wide-scope anti-realism), and yet, by design, the book does not directly engage with any of the core ideas of Buddhist philosophy. The goal here is to offer a “systematic development of key Madhyamaka claims” (Preface, xxx)[1] using only the resources of analytic philosophy and contemporary science. This makes for a stimulating read because the arguments on offer do not require the reader to know anything about the subtleties of Indian Buddhist thought. Nor do they need to have any understanding of how to interpret the complex hermeneutical moves required in translating the insights of that venerable tradition into the nomenclature of contemporary discourse. But for those of us who do know Buddhist philosophy well, the book presents as an intriguing and sophisticated double entendre whereby we are invited to both evaluate the arguments on offer at face value while also thinking about the extent to which they mirror forms of argument in Buddhist texts. For example, the opening arguments of chapter one against the mind-independent external world precisely mirror arguments made by Vasubandhu (5th century CE) in his important treatise Vimśatikāvijñaptimātratāsiddhi (Silk 2016). These sorts of isomorphisms are embedded in the book at every turn, and for me, this made reading the book highly enjoyable.

The book is systematic and well-organized. I immediately thought that it would be paired very well with Arindam Chakrabarti’s most recent monograph Realisms Interlinked (2019), which defends the view(s) that realisms of various sorts entail each other and is informed by a deep understanding of Nyāya classical Indian Philosophy. I suspect these two books paired together would do well for a seminar in cross-cultural metaphysics. In the remainder of this review, I shall raise some questions that came up for me while reading the book. I hope that in raising them, the conversation this book is having with its readers can be furthered in helpful ways. The book’s level of coverage is impressive, so it will be impossible for me to say anything comprehensive. Therefore, my goal is to raise one critical question for each chapter.

In the Chapter 1 we get a series of arguments against the existence of a mind-independent external world. What replaces it is a neural-representationalist theory of simulation or virtual reality. Instead of a distinction between a neural map, on the one hand, and the territory of the world that it represents, on the other, Westerhoff maintains that:

For the irrealist, map and terrain will coincide: we use the concepts to move through a represented world that is already conceptual through and through, built around a conceptual scaffold of notions like causation, time, space, logical implication, physical, mental, abstract, concrete, and so forth. Without the scaffolding there would not be any internally coherent world-like entity at all. For this reason we cannot assume that there is something beyond the map, something which cannot be captured by our brain-generated model. (63)

I am going to bracket consideration of whether or not our representations of space and time are conceptual. The worry I have here is twofold. The first is anticipated in fine style by Westerhoff: “Brains are as much part of the external world as broccoli” (67). Further, brains don’t seem to be part of the representational interface but its origin. How can the brain be the ground of the representational interface if nothing exists outside the interface? Like the eye that facilitates sight without being part of the visual field, the brain (on this view) is the engine for the representational interface, but is not part of that matrix (because it is what generates the interface). This seems to commit the view to a noumenal conception of the brain all the while denying that anything exists outside of the interface that the brain generates. It’s not clear to me how the two commitments can coincide.

Westerhoff’s reply to this worry is the following: “The system has not only incorporated the external world and turned it into a representation, it has also swallowed up its own physical basis, thereby regarding it as a representation as well” (67). I find this reply difficult to understand, as it seems to imply that the neural-representational interface has somehow consumed the external world and itself. But if that’s right, then the external world and the brains in it pre-exist the functioning of the representational interface only to be eventually subsumed by it. I suspect that what we have here is something of a semantic bind whereby even in our attempts to articulate a vision of anti-realism we run up against the ways in which our language invokes a world outside of itself as a condition of its sense-making. What this means for the coherence of Westerhoff’s approach won’t get fully cashed out until the final chapter of his book where he’ll argue that there are no foundational truths (in Ch.4). Even so, the radical conventionalizing of all truths doesn’t seem to assuage the worry that we can’t not think of the world as something outside of us that we are passively affected by in being finite organisms trying to survive in it. To this latter point, I want to further amplify my worry that these arguments for an anti-realist neural-representationalism do not give adequate attention to the way that evolution gives us reasonable grounds to conclude that the history of life and the world in which it has slowly developed vastly eclipses our representational capacities. That our access to that world remains mediated by our capacities for representation and sense-making is one thing, but to claim that there is nothing outside of this seems directly contradicted by the evidence we have of a world full of life that has existed for millions of years without humans in a universe many times older besides.

In Chapter 2 we are presented with a battery of arguments against two key claims that are very much at the heart of untutored introspection: that we are selves and that our consciousness flows in an uninterrupted stream. I am largely sympathetic with anti-realist views about the self so I concentrate here on the question of the stream of consciousness. I fear that Westerhoff, like many before him (e.g., Blackmore 2002), have failed to fully grasp what William James had in mind when he first coined the term ‘stream of consciousness’ (James 1890/1950). For example, Westerhoff claims at the outset of Chapter 2 that, “It is useful to restrict our present discussion to visual consciousness or the appearance of visual perception” (86). But this already gives up the game. It is not up for debate that visual consciousness is ‘filled-in’ in a number of ways because the information exchange between the visual field and visual system is gappy in many respects. But this doesn’t show there isn’t a stream of consciousness. In James’s original conception of this idea, the steady flowing continuity of the stream of consciousness is understood as a background of embodied affect that saturates, and creates a kind of gestalt halo around the relatively punctate contents of sensory perception. Here’s James: “numerous and subtle that the entire organism may be called a sounding-board, which every change of consciousness, however slight, may make reverberate (ibid, 450; Smith 2021, 252).

Westerhoff anticipates this objection (cf. 92–3) and claims in reply that: “It is considerably easier to suppose (and better supported by neuroscientific evidence) that consciousness is nothing over and above the processing of various sensory inputs (amongst which I include various reflexive self-monitoring processes)” (93). I worry this ‘inclusion’ is a bit quick. After all, interoceptive signals from the viscera and organs of the body and the homeostatic self-regulation they enable are very different from the affordances of sensory perception. As Mariana Babo-Rebelo and Catherine Tallon-Baudry point out, gastric, respiratory, and circulatory systems emit signals that have ‘pacemaker qualities’; that is, they emit “continuous sources of signals, sending the message to the central nervous system that a body is there—whatever the bodily state is” (2019, 47). Such interoceptive signals should be understood in contrast with exteroceptive sensory signals underwriting the gappy contents of visual awareness in the following way: “While sensory and motor signals certainly play a role, they are mostly emitted in response to a particular stimulus or as feedback from a motor action, whereas first-person perspective should be continuously defined” (Babo-Rebelo and Tallon-Baudry 2019, 49). So we have here a principled and empirically grounded reason to understand the stream of consciousness as an embodied background of affect against which the fluctuating gappy contents of sensory perception are tacitly understood from the first-person perspective.

In Chapter 3, Westerhoff makes contact with some of the philosophy and science that have developed these Jamesean ideas in the 20th century, in particular the enactive thinking of Francisco Varela, Evan Thompson, and Eleanor Rosch (1991). Westerhoff’s interest in these thinkers is in the context of arguing for the absence of ontological foundations. To this end he is interested in their understanding of evolution as being a process whereby phenotypes, and environmental features to which phenotypes are well-adapted are co-evolved (236). On this understanding of evolution: “The view of object-independent minds is as hard to maintain as that of mind-independent objects” (237). But two worries arise here. First, Westerhoff compares this situation to a ‘chicken-or-egg’ scenario in which we cannot specify which came first. Biologically speaking, the mutual dependence of organism and environment is about niche-construction, not with the idea that the organism creates the physical world. Historically speaking, the egg came first in the sense that the first egg that contained a chicken would have arisen from some non-chicken ancestor; that’s how evolution works—mutation and genetic transfer across generations from parent to offspring is the means by which there is the gradual emergence of new forms of life. So also did the natural world in which life arose predate the first-arising of life. The mutual influence of organism and world is the process that facilitates the slow transformation of life across generations.

Second, I can’t help but wonder if some of the argumentative agenda of enactive thinking could have been reflected on more deeply across the dialectical structure of the book. Specifically, enactive thinkers—especially those influenced by Phenomenologists like Maurice Merleau-Ponty (1945/2012)—use this kind of thinking to reject the realism/anti-realism debate as well as neural-repersentationalism (Noë and Thompson 2004). These are obviously positions in which Westerhoff has an invested commitment: he argues at length for both neural representationalism and anti-realism about the external world in Chapter 1. Lastly, it’s worth noting that enactive thinking also finds some of its mature expression via an interpretation of Buddhism, including Madhyamaka Buddhism (cf. Varela, Thompson, and Rosch 1991). Enactive thinking has also employed Buddhist ideas to argue for a kind of constructive realism about the self (pace chapter 2 in Westerhoff) (cf. Thompson 2015, ch. 10; Ganeri 2013, ch. 7; Mackenzie 2010). These connections remain unthematized in the book but strike me as relevant to a more nuanced understanding of the arguments and theoretical motivations of enactive thinking and their relevance for Westerhoff’s dialectical ambitions.

In conclusion, in Chapter 4 we get a subtle discussion of fundamental truths and their implausibility. My only question after reading this chapter was this: how should we understand its claims relative to the claims that have been developed in the previous chapters? In particular, the first two chapters seem to proceed altogether committed to an anti-realist posture regarding  the external world, the stream of consciousness, and the self. But if there are no fundamental truths, then these claims themselves come to have a provisional or conventional status. This isn’t too troubling, or necessarily a problem for Westerhoff’s view. I suppose I am just curious about some of the meta-philosophical implications. In particular, if there are no fundamental truths, then perhaps the realism/anti-realism dichotomies that are so much at the heart of various metaphysical debates might come to be understood from a more quietistic perspective rather than one of first-order investment. Thus, my question is something like: if we buy the arguments that there are only conventional truths, does it make any sense to be so invested in dichotomized debates about the existence or non-existence of various phenomena? Interestingly enough, there is a strand of interpretation of Madhyamaka philosophy that answers this question in the negative (cf. Tillemans 2017). I find myself sympathetic to these more quietistic responses to entrenched metaphysical disputes. I can’t help but wonder if Westerhoff’s anti-realist ambitions in contemporary philosophy, as well as Madhyamaka hermeneutics, represents a form of what the Buddhists call a ‘thicket of views’ that some interpretations of Madhyamaka would counsel us to distance ourselves from.


Babo-Rebelo, M. and Tallon-Baudry, C. (2019) “Interoceptive signals, brain dynamics, and subjectivity” in Tsakiris, M. and De Preester, H. (2019) (eds.), The Interoceptive Mind: From Homeostasis to Awareness, New York: Oxford University Press.

Chakrabarti, A. (2019) Realisms Interlinked: Objects, Subjects, and Other Subjects. London: Bloomsbury.

Ganeri, J. (2013) The Concealed Art of the Soul: Theories of Self and Practices of Truth in Indian           Ethics and Epistemology. New York: Oxford University Press.

James, W. (1890/1950) The Principles of Psychology 2 Vols., New York: Dover.

Mackenzie, M. (2010) “Enacting the Self: Buddhist and Enactive Approaches to the Emergence of Self” in Phenomenology and the Cognitive Sciences Vol. 9 (1): 75–99.

Merleau-Ponty, M. (1945/2012) The Phenomenology of Perception. trans. by Donald Landes. New York: Routledge.

Noë, A. and Thompson, E. (2004) “Are there Neural Correlates of Consciousness?” in Journal of Consciousness Studies Vol. 11, No. 1: 3–258.

Silk, J. (2016) Materials Toward the Study of Vasubandhu’s Viṁśikā (I): Sanskrit and Tibetan Critical Editions of the Verses and Autocommentary; An English Translation and Annotations. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.

Smith, S.M. (2021) “The Epistemic Role of Consciousness from a Practical Point of View” in Contemporary Pragmatism 18: 242–62.

Thompson, E. (2015) Waking, Dreaming, Being: Self and Consciousness in Neuroscience, Meditation, and Philosophy. New York: Columbia University Press.

Tillemans, T. (2017) “Philosophical Quietism in Nāgārjuna and Early Madhyamaka” in (ed.) Garneri, J. The Oxford Handbook of        Indian Philosophy. New York: Oxford University Press.

Varela, Francisco J., Evan Thompson, and Eleanor Rosch (1991) The Embodied Mind: Cognitive Science and Human Experience. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Westerhoff, J. (2009) Nāgārjuna’s Madhyamaka: A Philosophical Introduction. New York: Oxford University Press.

Westerhoff, J. (2018) The Golden Age of Buddhist Philosophy. New York: Oxford University Press.


[1] All unmarked paginated references are to Westerhoff (2020).