The Nonexistent

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Anthony Everett, The Nonexistent, Oxford University Press, 2013, 246pp. $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199674794.

Reviewed by Nikk Effingham, University of Birmingham


Anthony Everett has written a book-length defence of there being no fictional things; e.g., there is no such thing as Sherlock Holmes. This attack on fictional realism breaks into two parts. The first (chapters 2-5) gives a pretense based theory of how we should understand fictional talk. The second (chapter 6-8) is a straight out attack on fictional realism, with arguments both undermining the motivations for fictional realism as well as directly against it. Everett’s treatment is (unsurprisingly) thorough, well-thought out, and points towards interesting directions in the debate.

This review will primarily focus on the second part, but I’ll provide a brief précis of the first. After the introductory chapter, Everett lays out his own understanding of the Cognitive Account (closely following the Weinberg-Meskin formulation). This is a nice one-stop shop exposition. Chapter 3 examines how talk within a pretense can relate to the real world (and vice versa), e.g., explaining the tears of someone watching Othello by saying ‘Desdemona was just murdered’. Chapter 4 deals with issues in truth, content, and reference. Finally, the first part ends with chapter 5 defending against a variety of specific objections. Whilst the second part begins the more direct attack on fictional realism, Everett often relies upon the first part when, e.g., showcasing how we can do without fictional realist commitments by endorsing some aspect of the pretense approach.

Chapter 6 covers the motivations for fictional realism. Everett identifies two semantic arguments (e.g., drawing from ‘Sherlock Holmes is a fictional being’ that fictional realism is true). Everett is unimpressed, taking the account given in the first six chapters of the book to have given us good cause for thinking that such sentences aren’t genuinely true and are best understood as being uttered as part of some form of pretense. He then shifts to what he calls ‘metaphysical arguments’, canvassing both Alberto Voltolini’s argument that the identity conditions of fictional works will demand fictional characters and Amie Thomasson’s argument that the existence conditions of fictional characters are, as matter of conceptual truth, such that fictional characters exist.

The more interesting discussion is that of Thomasson’s work. Everett makes an interesting, and compelling, case against the existence conditions Thomasson supposes to be in play being a conceptual truth, which is enough to undermine the argument. However, I have some minor concerns that the burden of proof isn’t correctly apportioned at this stage. For instance, Everett says that Thomasson’s argument presupposes that fictional names (e.g., ‘Sherlock Holmes’) genuinely refer, which he takes to beg the question against his own theory presented in the first part of the book (p. 134). That seems a somewhat harsh indictment given the shift at this stage to examining the arguments for fictional realism — when arguing for fictional realism it doesn’t seem to be fallacious to proceed as if the rival non-fictional realist accounts (like the pretense account) aren’t correct. Indeed, something similar to the charge of question begging can be levelled right back at Everett in the discussion directly following this (p. 134-39). Discussing the analogy Thomasson draws between fictional beings and the example of baseball innings and marriages (whereby it’s clear that the latter exist, so should be equally clear that the former exist), Everett tries to undermine that argument by drawing comparisons with ‘hearts’ as in ‘John has a big heart, and that’s why he rescues so many puppies’. Everett calls such things ‘Hearts’. Intuitively, he says, there are no such things and heart talk is just metaphorical. I don’t necessarily disagree, but I do think that saying such things won’t help in the dialectic Everett is caught up in at this stage.

We can break ontologists into two camps. One camp thinks that questions about what exists are deep and difficult to answer (e.g. Lewis, van Inwagen, Plantinga). A second camp, with a growing base of support (populated by, amongst others, Jonathan Schaffer, Kathrin Koslicki, and Thomasson), pushes for ‘permissivism’: the thesis that all entities that might come under ontology’s microscope — and that we might question or debate the existence of — do, in fact, exist (so there are properties, events, holes, numbers, sets, etc.). I’d have thought that part of the very conceit of the permissivist’s theory is that things such as hearts will in fact exist — as we can talk about them (and existence questions receive permissive answers), hearts are out there. Intuitions to the contrary (such as heart talk just being metaphorical or that the world can’t be so densely populated that hearts exist, etc.) are exactly the kinds of intuitions that permissivists want to ignore (or redirect, saying that you’re merely mistaking the intuition that these things don’t fundamentally exist). Given permissivists are going to deny that heart talk (or food shortages talk, or hole talk, or event talk, etc.) is solely metaphorical, or otherwise in some sense not literally true, I think Everett has not got an argument that’ll prove compelling to someone already armed with permissivist intuitions. (Obviously this is just a sketch of how I think the debate will proceed — this book review’s crude conflation of Schaffer, Koslicki, and Thomasson’s varying viewpoints is just one part of the sketch that would need expansion.)

Chapter 7 comes out fighting with out-and-out arguments against fictional realism. Everett breaks the fictional realist camp into two brands: the Meinongian (who believes that fictional beings are there, but don’t exist) and the abstract object theorist (who believes fictional beings are abstract existents). Everett’s first argument against fictional realism focuses on how fictional realists deal with apparently true existential statements denying the existence of fictional entities (e.g., ‘Holmes does not exist’). Everett concedes that the Meinongian is well placed to deal with this (for their fictional entities don’t exist!) but then levels against them the charge that they can’t handle statements like, e.g., ‘There is no Sherlock Holmes’ (pp. 144-48).

There are two tacks the Meinongian might take. First tack: the Meinongian says that we’re simply restricting our quantifiers in such a case and there is only no Sherlock Holmes in the same sense that there’s no beer when I stand in front of an empty fridge. But Everett says there are cases where we intuitively want to treat the quantifiers as unrestricted and, yet, will still deny such sentences. Everett has in mind cases where we simply read sentences like ‘There is no beer’ or ‘There is no Sherlock Holmes’ in a book consisting just of sentences of the form ‘There is [or isn’t] an X’, with no associated contextual clues to guide restriction (‘There is green grass’, ‘There is hydrogen’, etc.). But I think someone who is already fond of quantifier-restriction strategies is going to be unmoved by this objection.

For instance, the eternalist buys into the quantifier restriction strategy, saying that ‘There are no dinosaurs’ is true for, when we normally utter it, we restrict quantification to over what presently exists. But if I picked up a book with ‘There are no dinosaurs’ in it, I’d assume that it was a true sentence. This is because, even in a book simply listing sentences about some entities existing or not existing, it’s not clear that we’re to read them as being unrestricted — indeed, those who are fond of using restriction strategies because of an overly prolific ontology (e.g., eternalists, mereological universalists, and our Meinongian taking the first tack) will doubtlessly think it’s very hard to end up in a context where quantifiers are unrestricted. They’ll probably all be united in thinking that finding such contexts outside of the philosophy room is well-nigh impossible. So the Meinongian is in good company in thinking that we restrict our quantifiers in just the right way for what they say to come out as true.

Everett does consider this eventuality as well. He charitably accepts that we might say that the domain is restricted to existent entities (so ‘There is no Sherlock Holmes’ will be true as Holmes doesn’t exist). But if that were the case, he says, then the concrete/abstract divide is much the same, so Platonists should, when reading the book listing existential sentences, believe ‘There are no numbers’ is true, for if the existent/non-existent divide is on a par with the concreta/abstracta divide, it’s natural to think a bald assertion of ‘There are no numbers’ naturally restricts over only concreta (p. 147).

Whatever the merits of this move, it assumes that we’re obliged to restrict in some regimented fashion (e.g., by quantifying only over existent entities). But those fond of using restriction strategies like this aren’t always fond of giving non-arbitrary, regimented principles governing what restricted domain gets quantified over (for instance, mereological universalists argue that we unwittingly restrict our quantifiers to not include gerry-mandered objects like trout-turkeys — but there’s no regimented principle telling us what things are gerry-mandered and what things aren’t). So the Meinongian might well say that the domain is restricted, but remain mute concerning what principle governs what the domain ends up being (just as the universalist remains mute). In other words, they just embrace an arbitrariness about quantifier restriction. This isn’t entirely unproblematic, and Everett will likely argue that this cuts both ways (i.e., as bad for mereological universalism as it is for Meinongianism), but it at least shows that the task of convincing the Meinongian that this strategy won’t work is a harder one than supposed.

Second tack: I think Everett is too quick in thinking that the Meinongian has to somehow explain the truth of sentences like ‘There is no Sherlock Holmes’ (say by appeal to a restriction strategy). Meinongians are under no special pressure to think that every intuition we might have allies with their chosen metaphysical scheme, so they could just say that motivations for thinking ‘There is no Sherlock Holmes’ is true are misguided motivations, and we should pay more attention to those intuitions that entail there being such fictional beings. The Meinongian would be faced with the charge of picking and choosing the intuitions one wants to ally with or shun, which might seem suspicious. Indeed, just such a suspicion is levelled by Everett against the abstract object theorist. When faced by the sentence ‘Sherlock Holmes doesn’t exist’ the abstract-object theorist — who must say that Holmes exists — might say that we should give up on the intuition that he doesn’t exist and just say the sentence is false.

Everett is explicit in his distaste for such a strategy whereby we pick and choose the intuitions we’re going to salvage versus those we’re going to ditch. If the abstract-object theorist says that sentences like ‘Sherlock Holmes doesn’t exist’ are false, Everett thinks this’ll require some linguistic or psychological explanation as to why we think it’s true. And if we give such explanations, why not (says Everett) just give such explanations for the initial sentences that lead us to believe in fictional entities in the first place? The same worry applies against the Meinongian. This criticism is well-placed, and I’m not going to offer a response to it here. It’s worth noting, though, that this criticism would threaten much of contemporary ontology. Just about every contemporary ontological theory gives its mark of approval to a straightforward reading of some intuitive beliefs and a mark of disapproval to others. For instance: a constitution theory delivers the correct results about the persistence conditions of statues and lumps of clay, but the wrong verdict on how many objects are in one place at the same time; many realists about works of music end up with odd results concerning a work’s persistence conditions; if we identify sets with properties, we end up with the odd conclusion that some properties have members; if we identify possible worlds with disconnected spacetimes, we end up having to say there can’t be island universes; etc. It is food for thought as to whether this objection either (dis)proves too much or could be expanded into a wholesale attack on many parts of ontology — certainly, as it stands, I’m not sure it’ll convince the currently unconvinced.

This is just one argument of many from chapter 7, and whilst I think the realist may have some escape routes with that first argument, I fear they fare worse with the others Everett presents. For instance, is a fictional character (like the Hulk or Pippi Longstocking) strong in the same way that a real person might be strong? Seemingly not. We must make a split, such that there are the regular predicates that apply to real things and fictional or analogical predicates that apply to the fictional things. Very crudely, we might think of it like ‘__ is heavy’, whereby it means one thing when applied to Mike Tyson and another thing when a native to the 1980s applies it to a serious event (as in ‘Man, that’s really heavy’ when discussing a relationship breakup). But then, says Everett, how are we to understand:

Arnold Schwarzenegger and Pippi Longstocking are both very strong. Between them they could lift a battleship. (p. 176)

The second sentence, featuring a single collective plural predicate, will now prove problematic, for it takes both a real thing and a fictional thing as falling under it. It should sound wrong to the ear in the same way that (returning to my crude example) ‘Tyson and my divorce are both heavy. Between them they could break a set of scales.’ sounds wrong to the ear.

Everett also spends ten pages arguing that when engaging in fictions, and when creating fictions, we don’t create or imagine fictional objects (pp. 178-88). This is all interesting stuff. I’m less interested by the worries at the end of that chapter about identity criteria. Everett initially says that we might not think any are needed for fictional entities given that identity criteria are hard to find for just about everything. That sounds right to me, but Everett then says ‘in the case of fictional objects it seems reasonable to require such identity conditions from the realist’ (p. 189) and proceeds with a lengthy discussion of the matter. I, on the other hand, don’t see what’s so reasonable about it.

Chapter 8 ends the book with a lengthy discussion of my favourite of all problems: the metaphysical indeterminacy objection to fictional entities. The fictional realist believes that statements about fictional characters ontologically commit to fictional entities, so a book saying that Bolo the Halfling was attacked by fifty goblins commits to fifty-one different characters. But this means that a story that explicitly makes the identity of some characters indeterminate (e.g., it’s explicitly indeterminate whether Bolo is also Grodo the Shortman) demands the existence of two fictional characters (Bolo and Grodo) that are indeterminately identical. As there is no indeterminate identity, there can be no fictional entities. Everett focuses on extant attempts to evade this from Benjamin Schnieder and Tatjana von Solodkoff, and Thomasson. The discussion is excellent, and I’m overjoyed to see the debate over this argument advancing (and look forward to seeing responses to it!).

The book is a good length (230 pages with a fairly small type size); the argumentation is thick but not intimidatingly dense; the issues it covers are interesting and the discussion erudite. The above passing observations on Everett’s in-depth and well executed discussion of fictional realism are just mild critiques, and it is an obvious must read for anyone working in fiction. It will also prove useful — and importantly accessible — to someone less involved in the literature of that area. So philosophers of language and metaphysicians, more broadly, should also be interested in reading this book as worked example of more general issues that they face.