The Norm of Belief

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John Gibbons, The Norm of Belief, Oxford University Press, 2013, 302pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199673391.

Reviewed by Errol Lord, Franklin & Marshall College


Gibbons' excellent book is about a puzzle at the heart of epistemic normativity. The puzzle is that it seems like beliefs are subject to both objective truth norms and subjective evidential norms. It is intuitive that there is something automatically wrong with false beliefs and it is intuitive to think that there is something automatically wrong with unjustified beliefs. This supports thinking the following two norms are true:

(T) Necessarily, for all p, you ought to believe that p only if p (2).

(J) Necessarily, for all p, you ought to believe that p iff you're justified in believing that p (5).

The puzzle arises because (T) and (J) can conflict. To take Gibbons' favorite case (Missing Keys), 'suppose you come home from work and put your keys on the dining room table where you always do, and while you're upstairs, someone sneaks in and steals them' (4). When you're upstairs you continue to believe that your keys are on the table. This belief is justified. So you are doing what (J) tells you to do. You aren't, however, doing what (T) tells you to do. In order to do what (T) tells you to do, you'd have to fail to do what (J) tells you to do and vice versa. This case casts doubt on the thought that we can happily accept both (T) and (J). If we can't happily accept both, then we need to choose sides. Once we choose sides, we have to explain away the temptation of the other side. For the lovers of (T), this amounts to explaining why justification is still important if (T) is fundamental. For the lovers of (J), this amounts to explaining why it is that something is automatically wrong with false beliefs.

Gibbons systematically argues that we should choose (J). The book is nicely organized into four parts. The first two parts are destructive. In the first part, Gibbons argues that we cannot happily accept both (T) and (J) by making a distinction between objective norms and subjective norms. He argues (successfully, in my view) that this move doesn't dissolve the tension between (T) and (J). It just moves the lump in the carpet. One will then have to decide whether the objective norms take priority or whether the subjective norms take priority. Otherwise one still accepts two norms that can conflict in cases like Missing Keys. In Part II he argues against accepting (T) over (J). He argues that there is no good way to derive the importance of justification from a norm like (T). In this part of the book he argues powerfully against influential constitutivist accounts of the 'aim' of belief and teleological accounts of the value of justification.

The final two parts are constructive. In Part III he fleshes out what he calls this Natural Reaction to cases like Missing Keys. The Natural Reaction to these cases, according to Gibbons, is that objectivist norms like (T) can't get a grip on us in the right kind of way. They can't guide us in the right way. This motivates his justification-first view. On this view, what determines what one ought to believe is one's reasons for belief. He argues that there is a guidance constraint on something being a reason for belief. In order for something to be a reason for belief, it has to be able to rationally cause that belief in one's actual circumstances. He argues that in order for something to meet this constraint, we have to have access to that thing. Further, he argues that only factive mental states like knowledge can guide us in the right way, and thus they constitute our reasons. Thus, on his view, what we ought to believe is determined by the factive mental states we are in.

In Part IV he argues that this view can explain why there is something automatically wrong with false beliefs and thus can capture the appeal of objectivism. He does this by arguing that believing that p commits you to knowing that p. In chapter 8 he argues that this, in turn, explains why learning that you don't know p or learning that not-p necessarily defeats justification. In chapter 9, he argues that the problem with Moore paradoxical beliefs is a rational one, not an objective one. The problem is that when one has a Moore paradoxical thought, one sees oneself as irrational in a certain way. This allows him, in chapter 10, to give a subjectivist friendly explanation of the objectivist intuitions. He argues that if you think truth or knowledge is optional in the case of belief, you will end up with Moore paradoxical thoughts. This is because one is committed to knowing when one believes. Thus, if one were to believe 'p and I don't know p,' one would be Moore paradoxical and hence committed to seeing herself as irrational. This is why truth or knowledge is non-optional, claims Gibbons.

Gibbons' book is extremely rewarding. Not only does he offer interesting answers to foundational questions about epistemic normativity, he engages with some important questions in practical reason in a way that few epistemologists have done. Unfortunately, he doesn't always demonstrate mastery of the literature about practical reason, which in some cases leads to bad arguments or good arguments against straw opponents (I'll mention one example of this shortly). Nevertheless, his engagement with practical reason enriches his epistemological views. It also makes the book relevant and helpful for key debates in practical reason. I strongly recommend the book to those who work on normativity.

In the remainder of the review, I will raise some doubts about two of Gibbons' central arguments in Part III.

Guidance and the Ontology of Reasons

Chapter 6 is a big chapter for Gibbons' project. It is where he spells out his Natural Reaction and argues that in order to do justice to this reaction, we have to accept many of the finer details of his theory. Not only do we have to side with (J), we also have to think that reasons are mental states. Here I will take issue with one of his arguments for this last claim. He argues that if we don't think that reasons are mental states, then we can't explain why reasons are normatively (i.e., deontically) significant instead of merely being evaluatively important. The argument he gives for this is very puzzling.

The issue is explaining 'the significance to the distinction between things that happen for reasons and things that don't' (143). In order to explain the normative significance of reasons, you have to explain the significance of this distinction. And he thinks that one cannot explain this if one thinks that reasons are facts. Why? He starts by drawing a distinction between objective normative reasons and motivating reasons. He stipulates that objective normative reasons are facts and that motivating reasons are mental states. He suggests that he thinks this stipulation tracks consensus in ethics. He is wrong about this, as there is a lot of controversy about the ontology of both types of reason (controversy that he would have done well to consider).[1] He then claims that practical objective normative reasons are intimately tied to value. In order for r to be an objective reason to perform some act A, r must help explain why A-ing is valuable. Again, he implies that there is broad agreement in ethics about this type of claim. And again, he is very much wrong about this. There is tremendous controversy about the connection between objective reasons and value.[2] So right off the bat we should be suspicious. At best this is going to be a good argument against one particular view of objective reasons -- viz., value based theories. Herein I'll just focus on value based theories.

Gibbons argues that, according to value based theories, 'the reason-for relation just is the good-making relation' (142) and that if this is true, then there is no principled explanation of the importance of the distinction between things that happen for reasons and things that don't. Therefore, these value based theories cannot explain why objective reasons make a normative difference. He starts with a paradigm case of an objective reason. There is a fire in the basement. This fact provides a reason to jump out of your window. The value based theory explains this by pointing out that the fact that there is a fire in the basement explains why jumping out is valuable. Compare this with the following case. An avalanche is barreling down the mountain. If it goes to the left it will destroy the village; if it goes to the right no one will suffer. The fact that the village is to the left explains why it's good for the avalanche to go right.

Gibbons somehow concludes from these cases that the reason-for relation is the good-making relation. But if that is right, then it's not clear that the value theorist can give a principled explanation of the significance of acting for reasons. A reaction done for reasons isn't important to the good-making relation. So it looks as if the value theorist is making an ad hoc restriction on which good-making relations constitute reason-for relations.

The value theorist should reject the claim that the good-making relation is the reason-for relation. There are at least two explanatory relations for the value theorist. The fact that my life would be spared by jumping out of the window explains the fact that I have a reason to jump out. That fact -- the explanatory fact itself -- is grounded in the fact that my life being spared is valuable. The avalanche case doesn't have this structure. In that case there is just one explanatory relation. To wit, the fact that the village would be spared explains why it's good for the avalanche to go right.

Once we see this, it's clear that the value theorist has something to say about the significance of action to objective reasons. This is because one of the relata of the first explanatory relation is necessarily an action. Only actions can stand in the first explanatory relation. So the value theorist can explain why acting for reasons is significant.

Thus, I don’t think this argument shows that we should abandon 'objective' reasons, even if we restrict our attention to value based views of objective reasons. Gibbons can't get the mental state view from these materials.

Knowledge, Guidance, and Being in a Position to Know

Suppose that the arguments just provided don't work and Gibbons is right that epistemic reasons are constituted by mental states. Even granting this, I think that there is a tension in some of Gibbons' views. In chapter 7 Gibbons argues that it's not just what you know that matters, what you are in a position to know also matters. To argue for this, he considers the following variation on Missing Keys: 'I'm in the dining room searching frantically for my keys. And there they are staring me in the face on the otherwise empty dining room table' (179). Suppose I fail to notice the keys and thus move onto another room. Gibbons thinks that my belief that the keys aren't in the dining room is unjustified and thus I ought not have it. This is because I ought to know better given that they were staring me straight in the face. Gibbons fleshes this out by saying that I am on the hook for the presence of the keys because I'm in a position to know they are on the table. He holds that what I am in a position to know affects what I am justified in believing.

So far, I am sympathetic. However, it's hard to see how this meshes with his other views. If I am unjustified in believing the keys aren't in the dining room, then some other epistemic reaction must be required. Presumably, I ought to believe that the keys are in the dining room. Thus, given Gibbons' other commitments, it must be that there is some reason for me to believe that the keys are in the dining room. The most natural candidate involves the fact that they are on the dining room table. Gibbons holds that reasons are mental states. Thus, he must hold that that fact is related to some mental state -- by figuring as the content, say. But just by stipulation, I am merely in a position to know that fact. I don't actually know that fact. Nor do I believe it. So it is not obvious that there is any mental state that the fact in question is related to in the right way to provide me with a reason. Without this, though, it's hard to see how Gibbons can think I ought to believe the keys are in the dining room.

The fix is to hold that being in a position to know is itself a mental state. Indeed, Gibbons explicitly says this later in the book (see 189). He doesn't dwell on this commitment too much nor does he argue for it directly. I find the claim that being in a position to know is a mental state very odd, and I think Gibbons owes us an argument. Otherwise, his story about this variation on Missing Keys seems to be objectionably ad hoc.

It gets even worse. Suppose we grant him that being in a position to know is a mental state and thus there is a mental state that can be the reason for me to believe the keys are on the dining room table. We learned in chapter 6 that Gibbons thinks that in order for some mental state to be a reason, it has to be able to guide us in the right kind of way in our actual circumstances (see 135 and 140). The problem is that when I'm merely in a position to know p, it is implausible that being in a position to know p can guide me in the right way in my actual circumstances. And this is so even if we grant being in a position to know is a mental state. If I don't even believe p, how can p guide my action?

On several occasions Gibbons seems to commit himself to the thought that in order to be guided in the right way, one must know the fact in question. So, for example, on 219 he says that 'if you believe on the basis of them [i.e., the reasons that justify], it looks like you know them.' Earlier, on 181, he says something even stronger, namely that 'in order to act on the basis of the fact that p, you have to know that p.' But if this is right, then in the variation on Missing Keys Gibbons uses above, it's hard to see how I can be guided by the fact that the keys are on the dining room table in my actual circumstances. If I can't, then that mental state doesn't meet Gibbons' constraint for being a reason. In turn, if this is right, then it's hard to see why I'm not justified in believing they aren't in the dining room.

Despite these worries, Gibbons book is well worth reading. One will learn a lot no matter what one ultimately thinks of Gibbons' conclusions.[3]


Alvarez, Maria. (2010) Kinds of Reasons. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Dancy, Jonathan. (2000) Practical Reality. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Lord, Errol. (2008) "Dancy on Acting for the Right Reason." Journal of Ethics & Social Philosophy.

Schroeder, Mark. (2007) Slaves of the Passions. New York: Oxford University Press.

Scanlon, T.M. (2014) Being Realistic about Reasons. New York: Oxford University Press.

Setiya, Kieran. (2007) Reasons without Rationalism. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

[1] For a nice discussion of ontological issues surrounding objective reasons, see Schroeder (2007). For  discussion about the ontology of motivating reasons, see Dancy (2000), Lord (2008), and Alvarez (2010).

[2] Popular views that eschew necessary connections between reasons and value include Humean views (e.g., Schroeder (2007)), good-reasoning views (e.g., Setiya 2007), and quietist views (e.g., Scanlon (2014)).

[3] Thanks to Barry Maguire for helpful discussion.