The Normative Web: An Argument for Moral Realism

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Terence Cuneo, The Normative Web: An Argument for Moral Realism, Oxford University Press, 2007, 263pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199218837.

Reviewed by James Lenman, University of Sheffield


Terence Cuneo, someone already identified by those who have been paying attention as a young moral philosopher to watch, has written a splendid book. The core idea is not a novel one and has received the occasional airing, a sentence here, a paragraph there, in the literature. But Cuneo is the first that I've noticed to really pick this particular ball up and have a real shot at running with it over some distance.

We commonly talk, Cuneo explains, about these two sorts of normative facts: moral normative facts, facts to the effect that something has some such property as being wrong or right or unjust; and epistemic normative facts, facts to the effect that something has some such property as being justified or irrational or insightful or a case of knowledge. Cuneo takes up the familiar thought that our common sense conceptions of these kinds of facts can be captured by certain platitudes constitutive of those conceptions. Two kinds of platitude especially exercise him: what he calls content and authority platitudes. Thus, starting with content, in the case of morality, Cuneo invokes Foot, endorsing her view that there are conceptual limits on what counts as a moral norm whereby only norms that have certain kinds of relevance to human flourishing can so count. And in the case of epistemic normative facts, we count as epistemic only norms that have certain kinds of relevance to truth. The authority platitudes tell us in both the moral and epistemic cases that the facts in question, moral or epistemic, are prescriptive and that their prescriptivity is inescapable, not to be undermined by our not having appropriate interests or desires or failing to belong to the appropriate social group.

These and other points of analogy between the moral and epistemic domains might well invite the suspicion that the respective prospects of realism and anti-realism in the two domains are not mutually independent, that what is most plausibly true of the one is likewise most plausibly true of the other. This suspicion is developed in Cuneo's "core argument" which runs as follows (p. 6):

(1) If moral facts do not exist, then epistemic facts do not exist.

(2) Epistemic facts exist.

(3) So moral facts exist.

(4) If moral facts exist, then moral realism is true.

(5) So moral realism is true.

Cuneo's defence of the crucial first premise focuses on certain key features that anti-realists have found objectionable about moral facts and the moral reasons they invoke. These objectionable features are as follows:

(a) the supervenience of moral facts on other, prosaically descriptive, facts

(b) the intrinsically motivating character of moral reasons

(c) the inescapable or categorical character of moral reasons

(d) the supposed mysterious nature of moral facts in failing to fit neatly into a naturalistic picture of the world

(e) the failure of moral facts to play a role in explaining other facts -- or a sufficiently rich range of such facts

(f) the great extent and apparent intractability of moral disagreement.

Insofar as these features are credibly supposed to characterize supposed moral facts and reasons, they are no less credibly supposed to characterize supposed epistemic facts and reasons. So where these familiar arguments are concerned the two sorts of normative facts stand or fall together.

(b) and (f) are the two cases where these claims are most likely to raise eyebrows but Cuneo valiantly makes a case for parity even here. In the case of (b) the concern will be that talk of epistemic reasons as motivating looks odd given that the formation of beliefs is not a matter of voluntary agency at all. Here Cuneo urges us to take a less narrow view of the range of things to which both moral and epistemic reasons apply. The former he thinks can be relevant to what we should believe as well as what we should intend to do, the latter to intentions as well as beliefs. Given this, he urges, parity between the cases is restored. In the case of (f), Cuneo stresses, as he does more pervasively (the thought supplies the book with its title), how deeply intertwined these two normative domains are and how surprising it would be, given this, if the depth and extent of moral disagreement were confined to the moral sphere. Nor indeed is it, he urges, interanimated as that sphere is with deep and pervasive disagreement on matters such as human nature and the credibility of various forms of religious belief.

Most of what remains is taken up with a defence of premise two, considering various forms of anti-realism about epistemic facts, and urging the reader to join him in rejecting them all. That more or less completes the argument, though a portion of the final chapter is devoted to a brief defence of (4).

The first form of epistemic anti-realism considered is epistemic nihilism. This is the epistemic counterpart of a moral error theory. It regards epistemic norms as simply delusory. This, Cuneo urges, is an unhappy view. It would be self-defeating for any advocate of it to urge that we have warrant for believing it. If it is true there can be no reason for believing anything. A fortiori, there can be no reason for believing epistemic nihilism itself.

Next comes epistemic expressivism, an epistemic counterpart to metaethical expressivism. Expressivists are divvied up by Cuneo into two sorts, the traditional and the nontraditional. By 'traditional expressivism' he means a straightforward noncognitivist form of expressivism that simply denies that there are epistemic truths or facts. By 'non-traditional expressivism' he means a sophisticated expressivism which essays some sort of quasi-realist reconstruction of moral truth and moral facthood. Each gets a chapter to itself.

Traditional expressivism gets into trouble, Cuneo thinks, because of the content platitudes for epistemic norms. These say that such norms must have certain kinds of relevance to truth. Here that thought gets some development. One of the things we do, Cuneo says, when we go in for epistemic reasoning, is apply what he calls alethic merit concepts to things. These, a subset of what he calls epistemic merits, are "merits whose presence in a propositional attitude indicates that the content of that attitude is truth-relevant." And being truth relevant is a matter of being either true or likely to be true or such that someone accepts it because they have done a good job of satisfying herself that it is true. (p. 135)

Given this explanation of the concept of an alethic merit, it would seem the bearers of such merits must be truth-apt. Epistemic merits more generally need not be truth-apt he concedes. And that seems right. Thus the command:

Avoid inconsistency!

or the intention or policy of acting in accordance with it are both epistemically meritorious but neither of course is truth-apt. Cuneo, if I understand him, would say this is a case of derivative epistemic merit. The epistemic merit of such a policy is a matter of someone's commitment to it being evidence that other things -- presumably the beliefs it issues in -- are true. Cuneo then applies this derivative/non-derivative distinction to alethic merits and suggests that we accept this platitude:

Alethic merit concepts properly apply to a mental state non-derivatively only if it is truth apt. (p. 137)

(I'm not sure the reference to non-derivativeness is doing much work here as, given the explanation offered of truth-relevance, there doesn't seem to be much scope for alethic, as opposed to epistemic, merit to apply to non-truth-apt things like policies or commands at all.)

Attention now focuses on cases of second order epistemic judgements. Are we to suppose, Cuneo asks, that in some such judgements we impute alethic merit concepts non-derivatively to first order epistemic judgements? If so, then traditional epistemic expressivism is in trouble. For we could only properly so impute such concepts if the target first-order judgements were truth-apt which is just what traditional epistemic expressivism denies. Were epistemic expressivism true, any such second order epistemic judgements would be confused and mistaken. So epistemic expressivists are compelled to say that second-order epistemic judgements don't involve the application of alethic merit concepts. But then, he says, they are forced to concede that "so-called second-order E-judgments are not epistemic judgments at all." (p. 141) So we should despair of the resources of epistemic expressivism to make sense of our ordinary epistemic discourse.

This didn't convince me of much. As we've noted, a command to avoid inconsistency or a policy of doing so are certainly epistemically meritorious. But these are not things we would accept because they are true or likely to be true or because we have been sufficiently conscientious in satisfying ourselves they are true. So their epistemic merits are not alethic merits. But they are certainly merits and they are certainly epistemic. So in making the second-order epistemic judgement that such a policy has epistemic merit, I don't attribute any alethic merit to it. I nonetheless make the judgement that it has epistemic merit, i.e. a merit that is -- perhaps derivatively, in Cuneo's sense -- relevant to the truth of something. And that is certainly an epistemic judgement.

Does the traditional epistemic expressivist get to say anything has alethic merit? Well, yes. In the first place the expressivist can say that if you follow epistemically meritorious norms such as the requirement to avoiding inconsistency, you will end up having beliefs that are alethically meritorious, true beliefs in fact, to a greater extent than you will if you do not. So the beliefs in which epistemic good practice issues are more liable to be true more of the time than those in which epistemic bad practice issues.

There are epistemic norms I approve and epistemic norms I do not. And I believe that if you follow the epistemic norms I approve you will end up getting stuff right a lot more reliably than if you follow those I do not. So truth enters the picture, on this noncognitivist view, insofar as the end products of epistemic good practice are true beliefs, not first- or second-order epistemic beliefs but regular prosaically descriptive beliefs about mountains and fish and the way to the supermarket.

Is that the only place truth enters the picture? Not at all. As I said, I believe that if you follow the epistemic norms I approve you will end up getting stuff right a lot more reliably than if you follow those I do not. And that's a belief. Its content is truth-apt and I think it is true. But what it is not is normative: someone might accept it who attached no importance at all to the objective of getting stuff right. What is normative is my telling you that because the epistemic norms I approve have this prosaically descriptive property of conducing to our getting stuff right, you therefore ought to follow them. And it is in this understanding of "ought" that epistemic expressivism comes into its own in ways that Cuneo's objections here do not seem to me to dent.

Cuneo turns next to "nontraditional" expressivism. Here he offers a somewhat questionable interpretation of Blackburn as holding that there is such a thing as normative truth and there are normative facts but that normative facts do not really exist, they are merely 'quasi-facts'. That would be a very odd view and I doubt if Blackburn holds it. If there are normative facts then, unless our use of the word 'are' is somehow Pickwickian, normative facts exist. And, as we might follow Crispin Wright, elaborating Frege's context principle, in noting the oddness of thinking that, once we were satisfied about the truth of a body of sentences, there might remain some further mystery about the existence of the things to which those sentences refer.[1] Cuneo however presses the point that quasi-realists surely cannot claim these facts exist from the disengaged and dispassionate "external perspective". If they did, they would no longer be quasi-realists but realists. If they did not, then the quasi-realist would be committed to a dubious view of existence as "a dyadic, scheme relative property." (p. 161) But this seems to me rather to miss the point. When the quasi-realist tells us that there are no normative facts from an external perspective he means simply that, from that perspective, normative concepts lack any application. Just as, from a timeless perspective, the concept of the present would lack any application. It isn't false, from such a perspective, that today is Monday. There is just no such thought to be had.

This talk of an engaged internal and a dispassionate external perspective gives rise to another of Cuneo's critical concerns. When we consider epistemic expressivism, we cannot regard the external perspective, as Horgan and Timmons do, as that of people engaged in 'metaphysical speculation' and 'theoretical inquiry', for someone occupying such a perspective will not take himself to have any reason to engage in inquiry at all. This is an interesting point and it has some force but it is surely far from devastating for quasi-realism. We may and perhaps should depart from Horgan and Timmons in not supposing the occupant of the external perspective engaged in inquiry. The core point we need to hold onto is that, from the perspective of a dispassionate (and we may suppose passive) observer of the world, there are no normative truths since an observer could find no application for the normative concepts in which such truths must be couched. From our own, inescapably internal perspective, there are such truths and those truths furnish us with reasons to engage in inquiry.

Lastly (well, almost lastly -- there is a short final chapter I shall not discuss), Cuneo considers what he calls epistemic reductionism. For the epistemic reductionist, epistemic norms constitute a system of hypothetical imperatives. The sort of reductionism Cuneo considers first takes the epistemic merit of an attitude to depend on what cognitive goals an agent has, and so to vary for agents whose cognitive goals differ. This, he now argues, is not very plausible. Thus suppose, taking a variant on one of his examples, I have the corrupt epistemic goal of always believing the worst of you. Then one day seeing you heroically rescuing some children from a fire, I cannot help but come to believe, in spite of my corrupt goal, that you are compassionate and brave. This is a belief rationally acquired on the basis of good evidence, so the fact of my corrupt goal won't stop us saying I am justified in believing you to have these admirable traits, that I know you have them, and so on.

Cuneo then moves on to consider various ways of seeking to render epistemic reductionism more plausible. For example there is the view that aiming at truth is constitutive of beliefs in such a way that states not governed by a norm of aiming at truth would not be beliefs at all. He questions this, urging that a belief formed by, e.g., wishful thinking in the teeth of overwhelming contrary evidence is still a belief and still open to epistemic appraisal. That's right of course though he is surely not here considering the most plausible form of the constitutive theory. On this more plausible version my beliefs count as beliefs only because their formation is, in general, governed by a norm of getting at the truth. Such governance is consistent with some of my beliefs failing to be so governed. But if all -- or even most -- of my supposed beliefs were formed in the light of a norm of conformity to my desires, they would, on this more plausible view, fail to be beliefs and so fail to be subject to epistemic assessment. So if I am to be in the believing business at all, I must be according some authority to the norm of truth.

Though more plausible, this view remains problematic. On a roughly functionalist account what makes my beliefs beliefs is at once a matter of inputs, what determines how they come into being, and outputs, what consequences they have for e.g. my guidance of my behaviour in their light. If I form certain attitudes whose formation, globally, is in no way guided by the aim of getting things right and which do not inform my behaviour in the way beliefs characteristically do, there might be no problem in saying these simply are not beliefs. But if I form certain attitudes with no regard for epistemic reasons but these attitudes guide my behaviour in just the way beliefs do, it would make somewhat more sense to say they were beliefs. Certainly we would subject them to epistemic criticism insofar as we would acknowledge it was a disaster for me that I was so constituted.

But that thought already suggests another reductionist line. Surely we all have a strong interest in having true beliefs. Most of us desire this intrinsically. And even if we don't, pretty well whatever our intrinsic desires, we have an instrumental interest in having true beliefs as, pretty well whatever our intrinsic desires, we have an interest in knowing how to satisfy them. Cuneo discusses Hilary Kornblith's urging of this point but is not satisfied. This is true pretty well whatever our desires, but there are still imaginable if rather bizarre desire portfolios where this will not be true, so the goal dependency he wants to avoid still lingers.

He closes the chapter by considering radical reductionism which denies that epistemic facts are normative at all. But this is inconsistent with the supposition that epistemic concepts are normative and so, Cuneo thinks, collapses into epistemic nihilism.

I think there is a lot to be said for epistemic reductionism. A lot of the time when we talk, in epistemic contexts of A being a reason for B, we plausibly mean no more than something along the lines of:

If A then B

or, perhaps more generally,

p(B/(A & e)) > p (B/e) (where e is some contextually specified body of background evidence)

or, in more folksy language,

A raises B's probability.

Are these claims normative as opposed to prosaically descriptive? A case might be made. Conditionals are the source of some philosophical vexation, probability of still more. But that is not the case Cuneo makes. And it's certainly natural and plausible to think of the fact that smoke raises the probability of fire as made true not by anything normative but rather simply by the worldly nomological connections between the presence of the one and the presence of the other.

We all agree that a reason is a consideration that counts in favour of something and, at the highest level of generality, we struggle to say more. In epistemic contexts we can say more: for a reason to count in something's favour is just for it to be evidence for it, to raise the probability of its truth. The reason why practical reason has occasioned such puzzlement is that there can't be evidence for an intention or an action so it's hard to see how to generalize the concept of a reason from its most natural and straightforward application in epistemic contexts to other contexts. But it is natural to wonder if, when we try to import our puzzlement back to the epistemic context, we do not risk getting hung up over a problem that isn't really there.

Of course we can try to deepen the sort of normativity involved by observing that our epistemic reason talk is also often concerned to communicate that A's counting in favour of B in the sense of being evidence for it is itself something that counts in favour of our believing it. That further layer of favouring does take us away from the realm of the prosaically descriptive but Cuneo's book fails to persuade me that that is something expressivism cannot handle.

Consider piscatorial reasons. Imagine we write a book full of prosaically descriptive facts about the catching of fish. Doing X, the book says, means you will catch loads of fish. Doing Y means you will catch even more but if you do Y you will have to use much more of a certain scarce resource. Doing Z means catching no fish at all. The book tells us all about the prosaically descriptive property of F-ness, where F-ness is the property of being the kind of action liable to result in the efficient catching of more fish, and of G-ness where to be G is to be the kind of creature likely to be an effective and efficient fish-catcher. And so on. When a newly evolved race of highly intelligent cows stumble upon this book, they admire it as an impressive contribution to the pursuit of truth, noting how admirably researched and accurate is its delineation of this large body of prosaic fact, a body of fact in which, being herbivorous, they have little practical interest.

Contrast what happens when a newly evolved race of highly intelligent seals stumble upon this book. Like the cows, they admire its scrupulous accuracy and reliability but, unlike the cows, they find these facts immensely interesting. For the seals we might say, these facts are no sooner discovered than they are invested with normative significance. F-ness is transformed for them into a thick ethical concept. G-ness becomes the name of a virtue. (Does this make piscatorial reason relative to one's goals or desires? Yes and no. We don't say seals have piscatorial reasons to catch fish, while cows have piscatorial reasons to eat grass. What we say is that seals have piscatorial reasons to catch fish while cows have no piscatorial reasons at all but rather reasons of other kinds.)

For us, epistemic facts are normative. They are facts that speak to the interest in getting stuff right and that is an interest we all share. That much Kornblith is right to emphasize. They are normative for us to the extent that the concepts with which we express them have come to express our endorsement of the ends this shared interest gives us, an endorsement we express most explicitly when we throw words like "ought" around in epistemic contexts. But it's not the case that all we are doing when we call something a case of knowledge or of warrant is endorsing stuff, just as we're not merely going on for endorsement when we say someone is wise or courageous. Language is complicated. Many of our concepts involve a complex entangling of the normative and the descriptive. A pure reductionism, offered as the whole story about epistemic concepts, would indeed miss an essential normative dimension. And a crude expressivism which supposed that, in applying any favourable epistemic concept to a thing, we were simply saying, Hurrah for that thing!, would miss almost everything that is interesting about epistemology, apart of course from our considerable interest in it.

I've tried to sketch in this review why I'm not convinced by some of Cuneo's arguments. But I have by no means discussed them all. And even with respect to those I have, I am conscious that the kind of small scale dialectical skirmishing permitted by a short-ish review can scarcely be an adequate response to so rich a book, an important and engaging contribution to the metaethical literature that is well deserving of far more extensive discussion than I have provided here.[2]

[1] Crispin Wright: Frege's Conception of Numbers as Objects (Aberdeen: Aberdeen University Press, 1983), pp. 13-14.

[2] With thanks for their helpful input to Paul Faulkner, Bob Hale and Chris Hookway.