The Normativity of Nature: Essays on Kant's Critique of Judgement

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Hannah Ginsborg, The Normativity of Nature: Essays on Kant's Critique of Judgement, Oxford University Press, 2015, 364pp., $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199547982.

Reviewed by Patricia Kitcher, Columbia University


Collections invite the question of whether the whole is more than the sum of its (almost entirely) previously published parts. The divisions of The Normativity of Nature into papers on aesthetics, cognition and teleology raise an additional question: What do these issues have to do with each other? Both questions can be given a single answer. Over the last 25 years, Hannah Ginsborg has developed a systematic and highly original line of thought that connects questions about what it means to look at the natural world through the lens of teleology to puzzles about aesthetic judgments and about the ability to acquire concepts. Since none of the issues are simple and the connections among them are surprising, the collection's achievement is to lay out detailed answers to specific problems while revealing the systematic unity across the solutions.

A leitmotiv of the essays is the intimate relation between the solutions to two seemingly disparate paradoxes. It was Kant's view and is independently plausible that there are no rules for producing or judging beautiful works of art. Yet Kant also maintained that in judging something to be beautiful, the subject 'does not count on the agreement of others . . . but rather demands it of them' (5.213, CCJ 98).[1] If there are no rules for making such judgments, it is unclear how the demand for agreement could be justified. Now consider the apparent circularity of Kant's account of concept acquisition.

In the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant's focus is not on concept acquisition but rather on justifying the use of special a priori concepts. Then, in the Appendix to the Dialectic, he raises a disquieting possibility. Cognition through concepts requires, but does not guarantee, that the multiplicity of nature not be so great that it is impossible to find characteristics that are common to many things (A651/B679). It is not Ginsborg but Kant who maintains that the solution to this problem lies in the same mental faculty that is involved in judging the beautiful, namely the faculty of 'reflective judgment' whose task is that of finding a universal for a particular (5.185, 189-90, CCJ 68, 76). Kant's juxtaposition of two hard problems and his appeal to the novel psychological faculty of reflective judgment have not always inspired confidence that an important or intelligible theory is in the offing.

Ginsborg sees that to make sense of Kant's proposal that a single faculty is involved both in finding empirical concepts and in judging the beautiful we need to consider his views about concept acquisition. These are sketched in the Logic Lectures. He assumes familiarity with the doctrines in the First Critique presumably because they are a variation of the well-known Lockean approach. Concepts are generated with regard to their [universal] form through acts of comparison, reflection and abstraction. In his example, a person compares her representations of the trunks, leaves and branches of different kinds of trees to find common properties that will be united in the concept 'tree' (9.94-95). As Ginsborg notes, the theory either invites a regress (how did the concept acquirer get the concepts of 'trunk' and 'leaf' and 'branch'?) or it assumes that complex concepts can be built out of simple features that are given to sensibility such as color and shape (HG151).[2] Further, even if sensible building blocks are allowed, the specter of 'grue' and 'quus' problems quickly arises (HG152). Any finite set of trees has many qualities in common, so why settle on trunks, branches and leaves?

Kant distinguishes his views about concept application (and so implicitly acquisition) from those of his predecessors in the Schematism chapter of the First Critique. Concept users do not label something a 'dog' by comparing a present image to one or many images of previously encountered dogs. Rather 'The concept dog signifies a rule whereby my imagination can trace the shape of such a four-footed animal in a general way' (A141-42/B180-81).

On Kant's account, the rules that he takes to be associated with concepts (and so to give them their normativity) are schemata -- rules for generating perceptual images of the objects. Acquiring the concept 'tree' would involve acquiring a rule for generating images of trees. As Ginsborg observes, this theory only deepens the mystery of concept acquisition: 'how are we to account for our possession of the rule or schema that enables us to see the presented object as a tree in the first place?' (HG 153) That is, how can a subject compare the schemata used in generating tree images to discover commonalities unless she can first produce images of trees according to the rule given by the schema for trees?

Ginsborg's proposal for avoiding saddling Kant with a circular theory -- and for solving the philosophical problem of making sense of concept acquisition -- is to put a Kantian 'normative twist' on Hume's dispositional account (HG 160). On Hume's view, sycamores and lindens are instances of a common concept 'tree' because when human beings see a linden tree they are disposed to call up images of previously seen lindens, sycamore, and spruces (HG159). The problem with Hume's theory is exactly the one that Kripke raises against a possible dispositional reply to the quus puzzle: 'that one is or was disposed to respond in a certain way on a given occasion cannot make it the case that one ought so to respond' (Kripke 23-24, 37).[3]

Here is Ginsborg's proposal for saving Kant from circularity (and for replying to Kripke) on concept acquisition:

what if we say that I take the idea of the sycamore to be the upshot not merely of a certain tendency in myself, but of a tendency that is universally valid in Kant's sense: a tendency that everyone ought to feel when entertaining the idea of a linden? . . . I take it . . . that this association between ideas is appropriate, or conforms to an intersubjectively valid standard governing how these ideas ought to be associated. (HG 160)

Ginsborg adds a reflective, self-referential capacity to the disposition to associate ideas or perceptual representations of sycamore with those of lindens: a capacity to think of this very association as appropriate in the sense that all subjects ought to associate these ideas as I do.

Before -- finally -- returning to the issue of judgments of beauty, I will raise an obvious objection to Ginsborg's account of concept acquisition. Does her 'normative twist' on a dispositional theory answer Kripke's worry about normativity? Couldn't Kripke reply that the fact that I feel that my association is appropriate, in that others ought to share it, does not make it the case that others ought to share it?

The problem with this reply is that it operates on the wrong level. Ginsborg is asking a Kantian 'how possible' question. Her thesis is that concept acquisition is possible only if humans have a primitive sense of appropriateness -- primitive in the sense that the judgments of appropriateness are not based on comparison to a norm. Her claim is not that making an association and recognizing it as appropriate, in that others ought to make the same association, guarantees that others ought to make this particular association. It is that unless humans had common tendencies to associate the same ideas -- and a reflective capacity to recognize some of their associations as appropriate -- they would be unable to acquire norm-governed concepts. That is, what justifies a person in presuming that others ought to associate sycamores and lindens as she does is not that she must be right about the particular case but that if she does not generally make this presumption, then she could not acquire norm-governed concepts (HG 129).

The connection between empirical concept acquisition and the puzzle about judgments of beauty should now be obvious. A person can 'demand' that others agree with her judgment of beauty even though she can point to no rule that they would flout in demurring, because she has a general entitlement to assume that her responses to objects are appropriate in the sense that others ought to share them -- because if she does not make this assumption then she would be unable to acquire concepts and so would lack all cognition (HG 129). Further, we can see that these two apparently disparate activities involve a common faculty because there is a common task that is performed.

Although judgment is introduced in the First Critique simply as the faculty that subsumes the particular under the general (A132/B171), Kant later elaborates by noting that applying concepts requires a capacity to acquire empirical concepts, a capacity attributed in the Critique of Judgment to the faculty of 'reflecting judgment' (5. 184-85, CCJ 72). This faculty is thus a 'subjective' (i.e. property of the subject) condition of the possibility of cognition. On Ginsborg's interpretation, Kant's position is that 'To have a faculty of judgment . . . is just to have imaginative responses to the world which involve a presumptively legitimate claim to their own appropriateness with respect to whatever elicits them.' (HG 129)

Since humans are capable of empirical cognition only if they have a faculty that reflects on the appropriateness of their mental activities, that faculty is available to provide an explanation and justification of the unusual feature of judgments of beauty that they demand agreement in the absence of a standard of taste. Again, the justification operates on an abstract level. A viewer can demand that others also find an object beautiful since he is entitled to assume -- because he must assume -- that other humans respond to objects as he does.

Although they involve a common faculty of reflective judgment, judging the beautiful and acquiring a concept differ in important respects. Judgments of the beautiful are aesthetic in that they rest on pleasure felt in experiencing the object (5. 204, CCJ 89). This hallmark of aesthetic judgments has been the center of another interpretive and philosophical puzzle about the beautiful. In §9 of the Critique of Judgment, Kant raises the question of whether the feeling of pleasure precedes or succeeds the judgment of taste. In presenting judgments of taste as aesthetic, I may have suggested that the pleasure comes first. But Kant is explicit that the reverse is true: 'this merely subjective (aesthetic) judging of the object, or of the representation through which the object is given, precedes the pleasure in it, and is the ground of this pleasure in the harmony of the faculties of cognition.' (5. 218, CCJ 103). Commentators have tried to save Kant from himself by suggesting that he does not mean quite what he seems to. Paul Guyer has offered a 'two-act' reading, where the judgment that precedes the pleasure is not the judgment of taste itself but an exercise of the cognitive faculties that precedes the pleasure (HG 32-33).

We can appreciate the fruitfulness of Ginsborg's account of reflective judgment by seeing how it allows her to resolve this issue -- which seems far removed from the acquisition of norm-governed concepts. Let's start with a more precise account of the pleasure at issue. In §10, Kant defines pleasure in the beautiful as 'The consciousness of the causality of a representation with respect to the state of the subject, for maintaining it in that state' (5.220, CCJ 105). In reflective judging, however, the subject takes her response to be appropriate to the object and so approves of it -- which is a state of mind that provides the basis for its own continuation. So there is one sense in which the judging is the basis of the pleasure but another sense in which the judgment of taste and the pleasure are coeval because both are produced by the reflective or self-referential judging of the aesthetic response to the object as appropriate (HG123). Guyer might object that Ginsborg is also resorting to two acts: the reflective judging and the judgment of taste. But I think Ginsborg can reasonably reply that there is just a single act of reflective judging that gives rise pleasure as well as to a judgment.

Scholars have long asked a basic question about the two halves of the Critique of Judgment. What do the beautiful and sublime have to do with any alleged necessity of taking a teleological approach to the study of organisms? One avenue for finding unity across these topics is to connect both to the idea of a purpose. Kant provides a definition of purpose (and the related notion of 'purposiveness') in the Introduction. A purpose is

the concept of an object, insofar as it at the same time contains the ground of reality of this object . . . the correspondence of a thing with that constitution of things that is possible only in accordance with ends [purposes] is called the purposiveness of its form (5.180, CCJ 67).

He maintains that beautiful art is purposive without a purpose (5. 220, CCJ 106). It does not aim at some good, yet it can only be understood as possible in accord with purposes. In a similar way, the arrangement of parts in an organism is contingent with respect of the basic laws of matter; yet it is purposive because the possibility of this arrangement can be understood only as the product of a purpose (5. 397, CCJ 268-69).

As Ginsborg notes, the weakness of this approach is not that it is unfaithful to Kant but that it is uninformative. Since there is no determinate concept of the beautiful, beautiful art cannot have been produced by adhering to the rules governing that concept. Nor can we assume that organisms were produced through the concepts of a creator. If the connections to a concept and a designer are severed, however, then what is left in the thesis that these two disparate things, beautiful art and natural organisms, are similar in being purposive? (HG 228-29)

It should be no surprise that Ginsborg's answer is that what is common to both -- purposiveness without purposes -- is normativity without norms. Just as a judgment of taste does not rely on an external standard, the judgment that a horseshoe crab 'ought' to have eight legs does not depend on an appeal to the purpose of an actual designer. Nor can it depend -- in the first instance -- on the concept of a 'normal' horseshoe crab (HG 248-49).

Organisms are different because their parts are arranged in a way that is contingent from the point of view of the basic laws of matter but that still seem lawlike. In the First Introduction to the Critique of Judgment, Kant illustrates the situation through a different example, that of an eye.

I judge [of the eye] that it ought to have been suitable for seeing, and although its figure, the character of all its parts and their composition, judged in accordance with merely mechanical laws of nature, is entirely contingent for my power of judgment, I nevertheless think in its form and its construction a necessity for being formed in a certain way, namely in accordance with a concept that precedes the formative causes of this organ, without which the possibility of this product of nature is not comprehensible for me in accordance with any mechanical natural law (20. 240, CCJ, 40).

What is contingent -- and thus inexplicable -- in relation to the basic laws of motion -- can be seen as explicable in relation to the concept of an organ that ought to be suitable for seeing. It is not required in the sense that organisms have to have eyes that are good at seeing (ask the moles) but rather required, in Ginsborg's words, for us 'to form a determinate concept of it which allows us to grasp its structure and workings.' (HG260) That is, when we confront an animal with eyes that see we understand their structure by assuming that they were made for the purpose of seeing.

But how do we (originally) judge that eyes ought to be suitable for seeing? We consider a sighted animal and take the existence of a capacity to see to be as it ought to be. Or to switch back to the horseshoe crabs:

we do not first judge that the horseshoe crabs in the initial sample ought to have eight legs, and then judge that they conform to that constraint. Rather, our judging that they are as they ought to be is a condition of our judging that horseshoe crabs ought to have eight legs in the first place. (HG 244)

That is, again, we must assume normativity in the absence of a norm. In making teleological judgments, the faculty of reflective judgment does not merely make a self-referential appraisal of the appropriateness of my response to the object. It also makes a double judgment about the object: it is and ought to be a certain way. Or, putting matters the other way around, in a teleological judgment, I judge that the object is as it ought to be and also that my response to the object in so judging it is also as it ought to be. And the reason that I am justified in the latter claim is that I have no other means of understanding it at all (HG 278-79).

In the last and most recent essay, Ginsborg raises a question that is central to her approach: does it really make sense to talk about 'oughts' without intentions? The particular issue concerns reference to functions in biology, but her defense is very broad:

according to the line of thought I have sketched, the possibility of intentional content, and a fortiori of cognition, depends on our being able to take a normative attitude to at least some natural phenomena -- specifically, our own pre-cognitive responses to the world . . . [This is] something like a transcendental argument for the intelligibility of natural normativity in general . . . [It] shows that we must regard one particular class of natural phenomena -- what I have called our pre-cognitive responses to the world -- in normative terms. From this, it emerges that the kinds of 'oughts' we are tempted to invoke when we try to understand biological phenomena . . . cannot be ruled out simply on the grounds that they phenomena to which they apply are natural (HG 342).

Although I agree with Ginsborg's general point that the fact that a pre-cognitive response is natural does not preclude the possibility of taking a normative attitude towards it, because such an attitude is a necessary condition for the possibility of cognition, the case of organisms seems different. It seems to me that the Darwinian revolution undermines Kant's transcendental defense of teleology.

Kant thought that the only possibility for understanding the apparently lawful, but contingent (in relation to basic laws), arrangements of the constituents of organisms was through the concept of a purpose. If an eye ought to be suitable for seeing, then we can understand why it must have some structure for letting in reflected light. But Darwin offered an alternative: the proper way to understand the contingent (with respect to basic laws) is in relation to the contingent -- a whole series of accidents. Holding those accidents constant, we can then understand why organisms must have certain structures by appealing to a raft of biological principles that operate at levels from the cell to populations. So although Ginsborg offers a sophisticated and successful defense of the intelligibility of taking a normative approach to the natural, I think there is good reason not to extend that approach beyond us natural cognitive (and moral) creatures to the organic world in general.

Whether or not readers accept all of Ginsborg's many expertly crafted solutions, they will benefit from her skill at framing very basic, but intricate, philosophical puzzles in an exceptionally clear way. Each essay presents interpretations of central issues in Kant's Third Critique (and, to a lesser extent, in his First Critique), but that is almost an incidental feature of them (except for Kant scholars, for whom the collection is an essential tool). The focus of this important collection is on advancing philosophical understanding.

[1] References to the Critique of Pure Reason are given in the text by the standard A/B pagination. Reference to Kant's other works are given in the text by the volume and page number of Kants gesammelte Schriften, Akademie Ausgabe (edited by the Koeniglichen Preussischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, 29 vols. Walter de Gruyter and predecessors, 1900-). In the case of the Critique of the Power of Judgment, I also give the reference for the Cambridge translation (Paul Guyer and Eric Matthews, trans., 2000) in the text as CCJ and the page number.

[2] I refer to the Normativity of Nature in the text by HG and the page number.

[3] Saul Kripke, Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1982).