The Normativity of Rationality

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Benjamin Kiesewetter, The Normativity of Rationality, Oxford University Press, 2017, 344pp., $65.00, ISBN 9780198754282.

Reviewed by Alex Worsnip, University of North Carolina at Chapel Hill


Benjamin Kiesewetter's book is a sophisticated and extremely thorough examination of the question of whether rationality is normative. This question may seem to many non-specialist readers ill-formulated, and to make sense of it one has to understand what the parties to this debate mean by 'normative' and 'rationality'. 'Normative' is used not in a weak sense that contrasts with 'descriptive', but rather in a stronger sense whereby rationality is normative just if there are reasons to be rational. Meanwhile, 'rationality', at least for several prominent parties to the debate, is used to refer to what is sometimes called structural rationality, where to be structurally rational is to have attitudes that are not jointly incoherent. So, for these writers, the question 'is rationality normative?' comes roughly to the at least somewhat less odd-sounding 'do we have reasons to be coherent?'

Kiesewetter follows these writers in their usage of 'normative', but not in their usage of 'rationality'. For Kiesewetter, to be rational is to correctly respond to one's reasons. That puts us back into a position of oddness, for the question 'is rationality normative?' now comes to something like 'do we have reasons to do (believe, intend, etc) what our reasons favor doing?' The question answers itself.

Given that, how are we to make sense of Kiesewetter's project? One answer, germane to his own presentation, is that it is a substantive project to show that rationality is not (merely) a matter of coherence, but instead consists in responding to reasons -- and is, thus, normative. But this glosses over the fact that, at least for some prominent participants in the debate about the normativity of rationality, the usage of 'rationality' to refer to coherence alone had the status of a terminological stipulation.[1] Such philosophers acknowledged that one can use 'rationality' in a more capacious sense, to refer to reasons-responsiveness -- call it "substantive", as opposed to "structural" rationality -- and that substantive rationality is, of course, normative. Their interest was in whether there is reason to be coherent in particular.

But there is a better way to reframe Kiesewetter's project, and to show its interest and importance. On this framing, the positive part of the project has two elements. The first is to give a detailed account of what substantive rationality consists in. The slogan that (substantive) rationality concerns responding to reasons is easy, but it turns out to be surprisingly hard to make precise. Ethicists often distinguish "objective" and "subjective" reasons, where the former are relative to all of the facts (no matter how inaccessible), and the latter are relative to one's beliefs. Now, there's plausibly no recognizable sense of the term 'rationality' that requires us to respond to our objective reasons. If the glass in front of me appears to contain gin and tonic, but -- undetectably and contrary to appearances -- actually contains petrol, then in drinking it I fail to do what I have most objective reason to do, and yet there is no good sense in which my act is irrational. But if we say that rationality requires us only to respond to our subjective reasons -- where subjective reasons are relativized to our beliefs -- then we have retreated to a notion of rationality that is arguably no more demanding than that of structural rationality, or coherence. For plausibly, coherence already requires us to (intend to) do what we believe ourselves to have most reason to do -- and more besides. So, if these are our only options, there seems to be no notion that deserves both the label 'substantive' and the label 'rationality'.

Kiesewetter's excellent point, however, is that these are not our only options. There is an intermediate, evidence-relative notion of a reason. Substantive rationality consists in responding to our evidence­­-relative reasons. Consider a different version of the aforementioned case whereby my evidence strongly suggests that what is in front of me is petrol, and yet I go on obstinately believing that it is gin and tonic. In this case, though my act of drinking would still not be a failure to respond to my "subjective" reasons understood in a purely belief-relative sense, it is a failure to respond to my evidence-relative reasons, and this grounds the fact that my act is substantively irrational -- even though I may display no incoherence. Though one could certainly quibble with Kiesewetter's particular version of the evidence-relative view, I will not do so here. In my opinion, he is clearly right that it is the evidence-relative notion of a reason that we want for an account of substantive rationality.

Kiesewetter's overall project also has a second, more ambitious element, which is to explain structural rationality in terms of substantive rationality. Why does Kiesewetter want to do this? The reason is as follows. Kiesewetter finds it plausible that the phenomena that are paradigmatically described as "structurally irrational" -- inconsistent beliefs, means-ends incoherence, akrasia, and other forms of incoherence -- necessarily involve irrationality. And yet he also accepts arguments, many of them due to Niko Kolodny, that there is no reason to avoid incoherence per se; structural requirements would (if there were such things) not be normative. Finally, Kiesewetter holds that it is hard to make sense of the idea of genuine rational requirements that there is no reason to comply with. It's hard to see how to square all three of these commitments. But, if we can show that whenever one has the patterns of attitudes associated with structural irrationality, it is guaranteed that one is (in at least one of these attitudes) failing to respond to one's reasons -- that is, substantively irrational[2] -- then we can square them after all. The idea is that these patterns of attitudes are ones that it's always rationally impermissible to have -- but not in virtue of sui generis, reasons-independent requirements of structural rationality; rather, in virtue of the fact that they can never each be sufficiently supported by one's (evidence-relative) reasons. This general strategy is not original to Kiesewetter -- Kolodny himself develops a form of it, at least with respect to some forms of structural irrationality -- but Kiesewetter offers a particularly clear and detailed statement, working it out carefully for a number of kinds of structural irrationality.

This second claim of Kiesewetter's is vital to his project. As I said, when many writers address the "normativity of rationality", they are stipulatively asking about structural rationality. Thus, if Kiesewetter had nothing to say about the (apparent) normativity of structural rationality, he might be talking past other participants in the literature. By making his second claim -- according to which the apparent normativity of structural rationality is explained in terms of the normativity of substantive rationality -- he ensures that this is not so.

But is the claim correct? One powerful challenge comes from permissive cases, where there are a number of different attitudes that are each permitted (though not required), but are structurally irrational to hold together. For example, suppose that given one's evidence, one may permissibly assign some proposition p a credence anywhere between 0.64 and 0.65 -- and therefore, that one may permissibly assign not-p a credence anywhere between 0.35 and 0.36. It follows that it's substantively rational to assign p a credence of 0.64, and substantively rational to assign not-p a credence of 0.35. But it's structurally irrational to have both of these credences. So, if there can be permissive cases of this kind, there are structurally irrational combinations of attitudes that do not guarantee that any of the individual attitudes are substantively irrational. Similarly, to take a practical case, suppose that one is at a restaurant and that there are three available dishes, each delicious in its own, different way. It's plausible that in some such cases, one's reasons are permissive with respect to one's preferences: no particular pairwise preference would be substantively irrational. From that, it follows that there's no substantive irrationality in preferring dish A to dish B, or in preferring dish B to dish C, or in preferring dish C to dish A. But it's structurally irrational to have all of these preferences together. Again, it seems that there is structural irrationality without any guarantee of substantive irrationality.

Kiesewetter offers no fully general response to the challenge from permissive cases. He discusses it only in the case of means-end incoherence (that is, roughly, failing to intend the believed means to one's ends). Here, the challenge is that when some end is permissible but not required, taking the means to it might also be permissible but not required -- so that both intending the end and failing to intend the means are, taken individually, substantively rational, but again, the combination is structurally irrational. Kiesewetter's response is that when one is means-end incoherent, one "increases the risk that [one] engage[s] in pointless activity, and this is something we have reason to avoid doing" (282-3). Consequently, even though means-end incoherence fails to guarantee that any individual attitude is substantively irrational, the combination of attitudes is something one has reason to avoid having, and so means-end incoherence still typically involves substantive irrationality.

As Kiesewetter acknowledges (286), this explanation fails to secure the conclusion that means-end incoherence guarantees substantive irrationality, since the proposed reason to avoid means-end incoherence can be outweighed, and may in some exceptional cases be entirely absent. He bites the bullet and says that there is nothing irrational about means-end incoherence in these cases. The result is a somewhat disjointed account, where most cases of structural irrationality are all understood in one way -- as combinations of attitudes such that it's guaranteed that one of the individual attitudes must be substantively irrational -- and means-end incoherence is understood in a quite different way -- as a case where there is an independent, defeasible "economic" reason to avoid the combination of attitudes specifically.

But the real trouble is that Kiesewetter doesn't acknowledge that the challenge from permissive cases that forces him into this deviation from his general view in the case of means-end incoherence in fact generalizes to other forms of structural irrationality (as illustrated with the cases of probabilistic incoherence and transitivity above). Each time Kiesewetter explains a particular kind of structural irrationality in terms of a guarantee of substantive irrationality, he tacitly assumes the absence of permissive cases. Moreover, if Kiesewetter were to extend his view about means-end incoherence to other instances of structural irrationality, he would end up with a view that he earlier rejects (§5.1), namely that the apparent normativity of structural rationality can be explained by derivative, pragmatic reasons to avoid structurally irrational combinations of attitudes, quite independently of the reasons for and against the attitudes taken individually.

Of course, one way out of this difficulty would be to deny that substantive rationality is ever permissive (in either the doxastic or the practical case). But this is a major task that Kiesewetter doesn't undertake. His only discussion of whether there are permissive cases takes place in §7.7. There, he concedes that epistemic rationality can be permissive with regard to whether we believe propositions in which we have no interest. But he doesn't engage the more full-throated permissivist view that there are cases where epistemic rationality is permissive with regard to what attitudes we take even in propositions that we are interested in, though the absence of such cases remains a presupposition of his view.

A second challenge to Kiesewetter's view that structural irrationality guarantees substantive irrationality comes from purported conflict cases, where substantive rationality actually requires structurally irrational attitudes. Kiesewetter denies that there can be such cases, but doesn't offer much argument against their possibility, beyond calling the idea of such cases "disturbing" (186), "surprising" and even "absurd" (250). Elsewhere, I've defended the possibility of such conflicts in cases of misleading higher-order evidence; I won't repeat those arguments here. But I will mention another sort of case, Kiesewetter's own treatment of which seems to commit him to such a conflict.

In the example Kiesewetter discusses (99-101), which is due to Kieran Setiya, you have a psychologically unalterable intention to smoke, and a similarly unalterable belief that in order to do so, you have to buy cigarettes. His aim with this case is to undermine the view that there is a sui generis, normative structural requirement of means-ends coherence -- if there were, he claims, it would have the consequence that you ought to buy cigarettes (since it is, by hypothesis, not possible to satisfy the requirement by giving up the intention to smoke). This consequence, Kiesewetter thinks, is unacceptable: you ought not intend to buy cigarettes, even as you continue to have the (unalterable) intention to smoke (101). But this just is to posit a case where substantive rationality requires you to be structurally irrational.[3] Thus, if the case undermines its target, it also undermines Kiesewetter's own positive view. (The point generalizes to other kinds of structural irrationality with unalterable attitudes.)

There is a further problem with Kiesewetter's account of structural rationality. Kiesewetter wants to acknowledge that many small failures to do exactly as one's reasons require, while falling short of perfect rationality, don't deserve the label 'irrational'. But he also recognizes that structurally irrational combinations of attitudes are irrational. This raises a problem for his account, since structurally irrational combinations of attitudes seem at best to guarantee imperfect substantive rationality, not substantive irrationality in his sense. Kiesewetter's solution is to complicate his account so that attitudes count as irrational when it is guaranteed that they are imperfectly (substantively) rational. One surprising feature of this account is that it turns out that irrationality is not just imperfect rationality above some threshold of imperfection. Kiesewetter's view of irrationality is in one respect stronger than this -- a guarantee of imperfect rationality is required -- but in another respect weaker -- a guarantee of any degree of imperfect rationality is enough.

Though unorthodox, this view does have the desired result of making structural irrationality come out as genuine irrationality. However, Kiesewetter would surely not want it to turn out that only structural irrationality comes out as genuine irrationality. This would yield the odd view that while rationality is a matter of responding to reasons, irrationality is solely a matter of avoiding internal incoherence: the pure coherentist about (ir)rationality turns out, then, to be half right. Rather, Kiesewetter should want major failures to respond to one's reasons to come out as irrational too. The question is how to understand the notion of a 'guarantee' such that this so on his account.[4]

Kiesewetter doesn't say much about this. He briefly suggests that Parfit's man who is indifferent to pain on future Tuesdays is someone who is, though not necessarily incoherent, "guaranteed" to be failing to respond to his reasons, saying that this person "has an attitude that cannot possibly be supported by sufficient reasons" (238). But the modality of the "cannot possibly" here is obscure to me. The most obvious interpretation is metaphysical: there's no possible world in which the Future-Tuesday-Indifference is supported by sufficient reasons. But if that's enough for a "guarantee" in the relevant sense, then it seems like some very slight failures to respond to reasons will count as irrational, which was what Kiesewetter was trying to avoid. It could be a matter of metaphysical necessity (perhaps because the reasons are fundamental moral ones that obtain in every possible world) that my reasons very slightly favor action A over action B; in that case, performing action B will be "guaranteed" to be a failure of reasons-responsiveness in the relevant sense, and so will come out as irrational. At the same time, many major failures of reasons-responsiveness nevertheless won't have this modal robustness, and so won't come out as irrational on this account.

A natural alternative here would be to give a disjunctive account: irrationality is present when either there is a combination of attitudes such that it's guaranteed that at least one of the attitudes must be imperfectly rational, or when a single attitude is imperfectly rational above some threshold of imperfection. But to go this way would be, in effect, to admit that there are two kinds of irrationality -- structural irrationality and substantive irrationality -- and that the two are analyzed in different ways. Kiesewetter would not be happy with this. Though I have been using the terminology of structural and substantive (ir)rationality, really Kiesewetter thinks there is just rationality simpliciter, where this involves responding to (evidence-relative) reasons. His view is most accurately put by saying that the combinations of attitudes normally associated with the term 'structural irrationality' necessarily involve failures to respond to one's reasons, and thus involve irrationality simpliciter. The phenomenon of structural (ir)rationality is thus explained away; the view is designed to show that we can do everything just with substantive (ir)rationality.[5] The disjunctive view mooted here gives up on this ambition; it posits a unique kind of irrationality, structural irrationality, which, even if systematically related to substantive irrationality, is nevertheless distinct and associated with a distinctive kind of criticism.

I'll close with some remarks on the way this book is written and organized. The first six chapters, which I have barely discussed here, are mostly negative; they cumulatively build up a case against the view that there are sui generis structural requirements, whether understood as normative or not. The discussion in these chapters is extremely comprehensive, arguably to a fault. Kiesewetter exhaustively reviews a substantial literature, and many -- though not all -- of the arguments he gives are restatements of ones already made by other philosophers (always fully credited and acknowledged), or are counter-counter-counter-maneuvers to other philosophers' arguments. A whole chapter (ch. 3) is devoted to a range of questions about structural requirements that ultimately do not arise on Kiesewetter's own view, given that he eventually rejects the existence of such requirements altogether.

On one hand, the comprehensiveness of these chapters makes very them useful for readers unfamiliar with the literature, or for graduate-level teaching; I don't know of a better and more comprehensive (opinionated) survey of this material in print. Kiesewetter is an excellent reader and interpreter of the literature; he brings out subtleties in many of the views he discusses that others often miss, and his presentation of complex material is crystal clear. On the other hand, the positive view given in the final four chapters -- which is where the book makes its most original and substantial contributions to the literature -- would have benefitted from further development at some crucial points. As such, there could have been some reallocation of space from the earlier to the later chapters.

Along with Errol Lord's strikingly similar view in The Importance of Being Rational--which appeared too late for Kiesewetter to take account of -- Kiesewetter's view is part of a resurgence of reasons-responsiveness accounts of rationality. This follows a period in which they fell into disfavor, at least among theorists of practical rationality, largely due to the influence of John Broome. On the final page, Kiesewetter describes such views as "in their infancy". This is perhaps an overstatement, since much of the pre-Broome literature took them for granted. There is no doubt, however, that the Kiesewetter-Lord version of the view is the best and most resourceful version to date, as well as a powerful challenge to purely structural or coherentist theories, and even mixed or pluralistic ones. No-one working on these topics can responsibly overlook it.

[1] See, e.g., Niko Kolodny, "Why Be Rational?" (Mind, 114/455), pp. 509-510; Nicholas Southwood, "Vindicating the Normativity of Rationality" (Ethics, 119), pp. 9-10.

[2] Or, at least, imperfectly substantively rational. As I'll discuss later, Kiesewetter wants to use 'irrational' in a stronger sense, but for now, for simplicity, I'll use it simply to mean 'not fully rational'.

[3] Note that Kiesewetter thinks that 'ought' implies 'can', and so by his lights it's not an option to respond that you should also give up the end to smoke, which is by hypothesis unalterable. Indeed, if this response succeeded, it would also succeed on behalf of the view Kiesewetter is targeting with the case.

[4] A further challenge is how to preserve Kiesewetter's above-mentioned account of the irrationality involved in means-end coherence, given this account of irrationality. As Kiesewetter acknowledges, there isn't a guarantee that means-end coherence involves a failure to respond to reasons, which seems to entail, on the present view of irrationality, that it isn't irrational, even when it does (contingently) involve a failure of reasons-responsiveness.

[5] However, Kiesewetter's own language on this point is not consistent. Though he consistently says that he is eliminating sui generis requirements of structural rationality, he moves between talking as if structural rationality itself is a genuine phenomenon that he wants to explain in terms of substantive rationality (e.g. 23) and talking as if structural rationality is a merely apparent phenomenon that he wants to explain away in terms of substantive rationality (e.g. 125, 158).