The Norms of Assertion: Truth, Lies, and Warrant

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Rachel McKinnon, The Norms of Assertion: Truth, Lies, and Warrant, Palgrave MacMillan, 2015, 251pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137521712.

Reviewed by Sanford C. Goldberg, Northwestern University


In the last decade or so, much ink has been spilled by philosophers examining the nature of the speech act of assertion. A central issue concerns whether we can understand the nature of this act in terms of the rule(s) that govern it. At least several dozen articles, an edited collection, and one other book take up this topic.[1] Rachel McKinnon's book is a welcome addition to this literature.

McKinnon's book takes aim at the most prevalent view in this debate, that of Timothy Williamson (1996). According to Williamson, assertion is the unique speech act governed by the knowledge rule (Knowledge Norm of Assertion), to the effect that

KNA  One must: assert that p, only if one knows that p.

Williamson's position is not uncontroversial. Both the hypothesis that assertion is usefully characterized in terms of the rule(s) governing the speech act as well as the more specific "knowledge norm" which aims to articulate that rule have been challenged.[2] Still, this approach is arguably the most prominent approach to assertion in philosophical circles. While McKinnon embraces the claim that assertion can be understood in terms of the rule(s) that govern it (p. 9), she rejects KNA as the candidate rule itself. In its place she argues for a complex rule that she calls the "Supportive Reasons Norm," according to which

SRN  One may assert that p only if

      i.    One has supportive reasons for p,

     ii.    The relevant conventional and pragmatic elements of the context are present, and

    iii.     One asserts that p at least in part because the assertion that p satisfies (i) and (ii). (p. 4)

The burden of the book is to argue that the various considerations Williamson and others used in support of KNA -- the alleged impermissibility of assertions of lottery propositions; the various versions of Moore-paradoxical sentences; the propriety of "How do you know?" as a response to an observed assertion -- are better explained by SRN.

The Norms of Assertion has various virtues. It goes into great detail regarding the notion of normativity in play. It contains a nice discussion of the phenomenon whereby a speaker retracts what she has asserted, in which McKinnon insightfully connects this phenomenon to issues that arise in connection with apologizing (pp. 157-58). The book also contains an interesting discussion of thegradability of normative assessment (pp. 187-89) and how such gradability might be accommodated within a framework of assertion's norm. Additionally, following the seminal work of Miranda Fricker (2007), McKinnon discusses issues of gender and power in connection with assertion (Chapter 11), and in so doing explores often-ignored aspects of our assertoric practice on which we might hope to improve. Finally, readers might learn a thing or two about playing poker. McKinnon, who had a six-year stint as a successful professional poker player (p. 176), has an extended discussion of the parallel between the norms of poker playing and the norms of assertion (Chapter 8).

To judge from McKinnon's own comments, however, the main selling point of the book is her unique account of assertion's norm. Most accounts regard the standard as invariant across context: warrantedness requires knowledge, or justified belief, or what-have-you. However, McKinnon's SRN holds that the standard consists of the adequacy of one's reasons, and she holds further that what counts as adequate reasons can vary from context to context. She is thus among a minority of theorists who endorse context-sensitivity in the standard governing warranted assertion. Others have embraced the context-sensitivity of warranted assertion, together with KNA, and argue for a view about the semantics of 'knows' (whether contextualist, as in DeRose (2002), or contrastivist, as in Shaffer (2008)). Still others have argued for the context-sensitivity of warranted assertion without embracing any contextualist or contrastivist semantics for 'knows' but instead by appealing to Grice's Cooperative Principle (Gerkken 2013; Goldberg 2015). But no one prior to McKinnon has defended the possibility of warranted assertions even in cases in which the proposition asserted isknown by the speaker to be false. By my lights, this is a radical and interesting claim, and since it is what distinguishes McKinnon's account, I will spend the rest of this review focusing on it.

McKinnon has several cases with which she tries to motivate the possibility in question. To my mind, her strongest example is that of Jenny the physics teacher. As McKinnon describes her, Jenny knows that the Bohr model of the electron has been replaced with the valence model, and she knows both models well. McKinnon goes on to describe the case:

Jenny also knows that her students aren't yet able to understand the valence model, but they are able to understand the Bohr model. Students of this age are typically not yet acquainted with concepts of quantum mechanics, and need to learn concepts such as the Bohr model as a stepping stone. So when it's time to teach her students about the electron structure of atoms, she asserts, "Electrons behave according to the Bohr model." This is, strictly speaking, false, and we may suppose that Jenny knows she's asserting something false. However, she makes the assertion anyway because, pedagogically speaking, it is the best assertion she could make. (pp. 61-62)

McKinnon regards Jenny's assertion here as warranted -- as satisfying the norm of assertion. In defense of this analysis, McKinnon argues that

Jenny is properly respecting her students' epistemic needs qua learning. Her asserting something false is done in the service of later being able to teach her students the truth (as we understand it). (p. 64)

Later McKinnon goes on to say that

Given the students' learning needs, and her knowing that teaching the Bohr model first (and representing it as true to her students) will best meet her pedagogical obligations, and be the best method for having her students eventually come to know about the valence model, her epistemic reasons [for making the assertion she knows to be false] are that she's aiming at her students eventually coming to know that (we think) electrons behave according to the valence model. While she doesn't have any proximate epistemic reasons for her assertion about the Bohr model, since she knows the model is false, she has distal epistemic reasons for the assertion. (p. 204; italics added)

So the analysis is this: in the pedagogical context Jenny has adequate epistemic reasons, albeit of a "distal" rather than a "proximate" sort.

I have several worries about McKinnon's analysis. These worries will generalize, I think, to cover any case meant to show that an assertion of a proposition known to be false can nevertheless be warranted.

The first worry concerns the plausibility of the verdict that Jenny's assertion is warranted. Her assertion of (what is expressed by) "Electrons behave according to the Bohr model" is pedagogically useful and appropriate, but to my ears it is not warranted as an assertion. McKinnon herself anticipates why one might think this: an "enterprising" student who becomes familiar with the status of the two models can challenge the warrantedness of Jenny's assertion (p. 64). McKinnon thinks that in response Jenny could vindicate the warrantedness of her assertion by noting the pedagogical context and her own distal epistemic reasons. But to my ears such a reply sounds more like a legitimate (pedagogy-based) excuse of her failure to satisfy the norm than a vindication of the warrantedness of the assertion. Still, McKinnon is not without recourse to respond to this, and in any case I do not want to put too much stock in my own intuitions about particular verdicts.

A second, more substantial worry concerns McKinnon's use of the distinction between proximate and distal epistemic reasons. If distal epistemic reasons, in the service of most efficiently getting someone to know something later on, can satisfy the "sufficient reasons" standard, it appears that we will get incorrect verdicts in other cases. Here is an illustration. Jones is Smith's friend, and Smith believes that Jones suffers from a terrible (and unjustified) lack of self-confidence in her math abilities. Smith knows that although Jones is not the best math student in the class, she (Jones) is a very good math student. But Smith also knows that Jones will invariably discount whatever Smith tells her on this score: such is Jones' psychological constitution. So, since Smith wants to get Jones to believe what is true (that Jones is a very good math student), Smith asserts to Jones, 'You are the best math student in the class,' reasonably regarding this to be the best way (given Jones's inevitable discounting of what Smith says) to get Jones to believe the true proposition. While Smith "doesn't have any proximate epistemic reasons for her assertion," as she knows that it is false, she does have "distal epistemic reasons for her assertion." It seems like this case parallels Jenny's case above. In fact it's better since in this case Smith has reasons to think that Jones (unlike Jenny's students) won't form the false belief in the first place. Yet even so, it seems to me that Smith's assertion, though kind and well-intentioned and the best way to bring about an epistemically laudable end, is not warranted as an assertion -- even if it is permissible in a broader sense (since Smith's obligations to Jones as a friend might trump her obligations as an asserter).

A third related worry arises for any view of assertion's norm, such as McKinnon's, which allows that there are cases in which an assertion is warranted even though the speaker herself does not believe what she asserted.[3] The worry is that such an account is in tension, and perhaps is incompatible, with another doctrine many people in this literature (McKinnon included) embrace. We might call this the doctrine of Epistemic Self-Representation in Assertion, two versions of which are

ESRAK     To assert that p is to represent oneself as knowing that p.

ESRAB     To assert that p is to represent oneself as believing that p.

While virtually everyone accepts ESRAB,[4] ESRAK is also very popular. [5] Now if either or both versions of ESRA is/are true, we ought to be able to explain why assertion has the feature(s) in question. After all, if one who asserts so represents herself, this would appear to be an interesting feature of assertion, and we would hope to be able to explain this feature by appeal to the nature of the speech act itself. And if we think that the nature of assertion is given by the rule or norm that governs this speech act, as McKinnon does (p. 9), we might think to explain the ESRA phenomena in terms of the norm of assertion itself. Happily, the sought-after explanation is near-to-hand so long as we think that assertion's norm cannot be satisfied unless the speaker knows/believes the asserted content. For in that case, we appear to be able to derive the relevant ESRA phenomena from the norm of assertion itself together with the assumption that one who performs a rule-governed act entitles those observing her to hold her to the rules.[6]

But how are we supposed to explain ESRAB or ESRAK, if (as with McKinnon's Sufficient Reasons Norm) one can satisfy assertion's norm without knowing or even believing the asserted content? Here is what McKinnon has to say on this score:

When one asserts that p, one both represents oneself as having the authority to assert that p and represents oneself as believing that p (and perhaps as knowing that p). That is, in representing oneself as having assertoric authority to assert a proposition, one thereby also represents oneself as believing the proposition. It is my view that the latter is derivative from the former. (p. 134)

Later on, McKinnon is less guarded, as she endorses the unqualified view that "in representing oneself as having the authority to assert, one also thereby represents oneself as believing and knowing." (p. 201; italics added) But this just raises our question: how can one's self-representation as believing and knowing that p "derive from" one's representing oneself as having the authority to assert that p when by hypothesis having such authority (= satisfying assertion's norm) does not require that one know or even believe the content asserted?

To be clear, the challenge is not to make sense of how the self-representation in ESRA can be false: there is no mystery in the fact that one can assert what one doesn't know or believe. And, although I have doubts on this score, I am prepared to grant McKinnon's claim (pp. 134-35 and 201) that an assertion can be warranted even when the speaker falsely represents herself in this way. The real challenge is to explain how it is that in asserting as one does, one "thereby" represents oneself in this manner in the first place. Given McKinnon's understanding of the "sufficient reasons" standard, I am not confident that she is entitled to embrace such a view. (On a related side note I should add that, McKinnon's own apparent view to the contrary (p. 135) notwithstanding, given SRN it is not at all clear why belief should be required for an assertion to be sincere. On the assumption that one's assertion is sincere so long as one honestly regards oneself as satisfying assertion's norm, it seems that if SRN is the norm, sincerity is a matter of honestly regarding oneself as having adequate reasons whether or not one believes what one asserts.)

In short, the question I have for McKinnon's view is how it regards the inference from "representing oneself as having the authority to assert that p" to "representing oneself as believing and knowing that p." Given the use to which McKinnon herself puts ESRA, it will not do to regard this as an inductive inference that holds for the most part. This is because McKinnon uses ESRA (p. 134) to explain the Moore-paradoxicality of sentences of such forms as 'p, but I do not know that p,' and 'p, but I do not believe that p.' As McKinnon herself recognizes, to pull off this explanation we need to forestall the very possibility of cases in which it is warranted to assert what these sentences express. And if the ESRA phenomena hold only for the most part, we have not ruled out that possibility.

Still, I do not want these critical comments and questions to cast a shadow over my regard for McKinnon's book. It is full of interesting and wide-ranging thoughts about assertion, it challenges many popular views in the literature, and it expands the focus of discussion in several promising directions. For these reasons, I recommended it to anyone whose philosophical work leads them to think about the nature of assertion.


Black, M. 1952. "Saying and Disbelieving," Analysis vol. 13, pp. 25-33.

Brown, J., and Cappelen, H. 2011: Assertion: New Essays. (Oxford University Press).

Brown, J. 2010. "Knowledge and Assertion," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, vol. 81, no. 3, pp. 549-66.

Cappelen, H. 2011: "Against Assertion," in Assertion, J. Brown and J. Cappelen, eds., (Oxford University Press), pp. 21-48.

DeRose, K. 2002. "Assertion, Knowledge, and Context," Philosophical Review, vol. 111, pp. 167-203.

Douven, I. 2006. "Assertion, Knowledge, and Rational Credibility," Philosophical Review, vol. 115, pp. 449-485.

Fricker, M. 2007. Epistemic Injustice: Power and the Ethics of Knowing. (Oxford University Press).

Goldberg, S. 2015. Assertion: On the Philosophical Significance of Assertoric Speech. (Oxford University Press).

Goldberg, S. Forthcoming: "New Work on Assertion," American Philosophical Quarterly.

Lackey, J. 2007. "Norms of Assertion," Nous, vol. 41, no. 4, pp. 594-628.

Lackey, J. 2011. "Assertion and Isolated Secondhand Knowledge," in Assertion, J. Brown and J. Cappelen, eds., (Oxford University Press), pp. 251-75.

Maitra, I. 2011: "Assertion, Norms, and Games." In Assertion, J. Brown and J. Cappelen, eds., (Oxford University Press), pp. 277-296.

Moore, G. E. 1993: "Moore's Paradox." In T. Baldwin, ed., G. E. Moore: Selected writings. (Routledge).

Pagin, P. 2011: "Information and Assertoric Force." In Assertion, J. Brown and J. Cappelen, eds., (Oxford University Press), pp. 97-136.

Schaffer, J. 2008. "Knowledge in the Image of Assertion," Philosophical Issues, vol. 18, no. 1, pp. 1-19.

Slote, M. 1979. "Assertion and Belief." In Papers on Language and Logic, J. Dancy, ed., (Keele University Library).

Weiner, M. 2005. "Must We Know What We Say?" Philosophical Review, vol. 114, pp. 227-51.

Williamson, T. 1996. "Knowing and Asserting," Philosophical Review, vol. 105, pp. 489-523.

[1] See Goldberg (forthcoming ) for a review of the most recent work. Full disclosure: the book is my own, Goldberg (2015). For the volume, see Brown and Cappelen (2011).

[2] Cappelen (2011), Pagin (2011), and Maitra (2011), among others, challenge the idea that assertion should be understood in terms of a constitutive rule. Weiner (2005), Douven (2006), and Lackey (2007), among others, challenge the idea that the rule is KNA. Interestingly, still others have argued that there are cases in which knowledge is not sufficient for warranting assertion; see Brown (2010) and Lackey (2011).

[3] Since my own account is such a view, I addressed this worry at length (Goldberg 2015: Chapter 11, esp. pp. 276-85), eventually abandoning ESRA (a doctrine to be characterized in what follows).

[4] Two exceptions are Goldberg (2015) and (perhaps) Lackey (2007).

[5] ESRA-K is endorsed by Moore (1993), Black (1952), Slote (1979), Unger (1975), Williamson (1996), and many others.

[6] I present a detailed version of this derivation in Goldberg (2015: 155-57).