The Notions of George Berkeley: Self, Substance, Unity and Power

Berkeley Notions

James Hill, The Notions of George Berkeley: Self, Substance, Unity and Power, Bloomsbury Academic, 2022, 167pp., $103.50 (hbk), ISBN 9781350299689.


Reviewed by Genevieve Migely, Cornell College


In The Notions of George Berkeley, James Hill offers a systematic treatment of Berkeley’s doctrine of notions premised upon Berkeley’s ontology. Hill posits that Berkeley’s dualism of active minds and passive ideas drives the role notions play in his overall philosophy. Using this ontological foundation, Hill constructs a holistic, coherent framework for understanding Berkeley’s use of notions. This rich, detailed, historically-based interpretation of Berkeley remains true to what Berkeley himself intended to do by demonstrating the philosophical maneuvers Berkeley undertakes in response to his desire to set himself apart from his modern contemporaries. The result is a comprehensive view of Berkeley’s philosophy encompassing the course of his works, from his Notebooks to Siris, while situating Berkeley in the context of the philosophical discourse of his time. As a rare, welcome shift in Berkeley scholarship, Hill offers a charitable read of Berkeley’s doctrine of notions that achieves consistency between Berkeley’s logic and philosophical tenets.

Hill’s goal is to demonstrate that Berkeley’s doctrine of notions is not some ad hoc addition designed in a lame attempt to render his philosophy consistent with knowledge of self. The most common view is that Berkeley tries, but ultimately fails, to put forth a coherent way for an immaterialist and idealist such as himself to have direct knowledge of his active mind. In contrast, Hill positions himself to reveal how the doctrine of notions was all along a part of Berkeley’s overall system that continued to develop as Berkeley’s philosophy did. Hill frames his argument in terms of the empiricist and rationalist paradigm overshadowing much of modern philosophy interpretation, and makes a bold challenge to the standard empiricist framing of Berkeley. In refusing to allow a passive idea of an active mind, Hill places Berkeley on a middle road between empiricist concepts and rationalist innatism. For Hill, Berkeley retains his empiricist account of ideas, but dabbles in an innatist theory of notions. The development of Berkeley’s theory of mind, as shown through Hill’s lens, is both innovative and original as Berkeley holds strongly to his dualism and the ensuing denial of any perceptual model for knowledge of one’s active self.

Having set up his aim and approach, Hill begins his interpretive journey with the philosophical landscape of Berkeley’s development. He lays out the modern perceptual approach to self-knowledge from Descartes, Hobbes, Malebranche, and Locke. Though each differs in their fundamental metaphysical positions, they base their knowledge, or lack thereof, of self on having an idea of it. Hill then places Berkeley into this context in both his desire to have an immediate, direct knowledge of mind to bolster his idealism and in his strong denial that such knowledge is by way of idea to support his dualism. Berkeley’s ontological underpinnings prohibit passive perceptual knowledge of one’s active self. Pointing out multiple missteps in Berkeleyan interpretation, Hall provides textually strong proof that spirit can be known immediately as Berkeley claims. The introduction of notions in later editions of Berkeley’s works is presented by Hill not as some afterthought, but instead as the continuing development of Berkeley’s position that active beings and their activities can be known, but not by way of passive ideas. Here Hill renders Berkeley’s epistemology both coherent and consistent with his ontology. Knowing an active being and its activities must be like such activity, and so knowledge by notion is a doing. There is no idea of self-standing before one’s mind as the object of its perception. Instead, Hill gracefully captures the nuance of Berkeley’s epistemological innovation in his use of notion as a difference in kind of knowledge. Notions are as active as the things they are of. This retains Berkeley’s dualism and grounds his idealism. Only active minds and passive ideas exist, and both can be directly known by the means proper to each type of being.

Once Hill has shown how Berkeley expands the way in which one may know things, he investigates how his account of notions bears resemblance to innatism. Though Berkeley would not be in line with a crude form of innatism, such as is assumed to be offered by Descartes in which ideas are stamped upon the mind at its inception, Hill views him as being similar to a more refined form of innatism in which innate content is available to finite minds in its ability to have knowledge of its nature. Hill highlights a few passages from Berkeley’s late work Siris in which Berkeley appears to give a nod of approval to Plato’s innate ideas of being and goodness. Hill reaffirms that notions for Berkeley cannot be innate ideas present as passive objects before the mind. Instead, notions are innate to the active nature of our mind as the potential awareness of our own mental activities. Given this crucial distinction between innate ideas and innate notions, one wonders why Hill presses a semi-innatist reading of Berkeley. He begins his chapter on notions and innatisim and ends his final chapter with the caveat that he does not recommend labeling Berkeley as ‘innatist,’ so one questions Hill’s continued line of argumentation that Berkeley’s view is, and is not, similar to this category. Hill’s train of reasoning here may create more problems than it solves in using the same problematic paradigm scholars have imposed upon modern philosophers. Hill employs a limited version of empiricism in which all knowledge must be from sense. Strangely, this oversimplifies Locke’s position in which all ideas must be from experience, including both sense and reflection. Lockean ideas of reflection are ideas derived from the experience of one’s own mental activities. Though Hill clearly demonstrates how and why Berkeley diverges from knowledge of activity by means of passive idea, he dismisses the use of experience as the deciding factor in being placed in the empiricist category. Hill points out that even a rationalist like Plato uses some experience to reveal knowledge of innate Forms, so experience itself may not clearly differentiate rationalist from empiricist. Given these misgivings about how to clearly differentiate empiricist and rationalist positions, one wonders if Hill does Berkeley a disservice by perpetuating the paradigm rather than breaking free of it. Hill’s innatist reading of Berkeley, though insightful and nuanced, still places limits on how to read Berkeley and so is liable to misinterpretation. Innate content is more commonly construed as ideas present to the mind from its inception rather than as what naturally arises from the essential nature of the mind itself. Hill narrows the use of empiricism and widens the scope of innatism to try to capture Berkeley’s doctrine of notions as knowledge by activity derived from the very nature of an active being. One’s self-knowledge emanating from one’s nature is both experiential and essential to the nature of the thing. Trying to fit Berkeley into one category and out of another may serve to conceal what Hill hopes to show is original, innovative, and uniquely Berkeleyan.

Midway through his book, Hill has reached his main interpretative position that notions operate as activity consistent with Berkeley’s dualism, which sharply contrasts active from passive beings. At this point, Hill pauses to address a glaring concern in his interpretation: the active finite mind is deemed passive in sense perception in a much-discussed passage in the Dialogues (DHP 196–7). The finite mind’s active nature is now compromised by its passivity when it perceives by sense. Having grounded his interpretation on Berkeley’s strict dualism, Hill finds himself needing to address this inconsistency in his and Berkeley’s overall arguments. Hill’s attempt at reconciliation between an entirely active mind and its passivity in sense perception is to offer a developmental staging of Berkeley’s thoughts on mind, and so treats this particular passage as an early stage where Berkeley had yet to attain a coherent position. Hill proceeds to offer textual evidence in which Berkeley opens up his notion of mental activity to include more than simple acts of will to produce, change or end ideas. Although Hill is to be applauded for seeing a richer notion of mental activity present in Berkeley’s writing, this does not change the claim that Berkeley held an inconsistent position, even if only a temporary one. Perhaps dissatisfied with this himself, Hill continues to work out an interesting version of what occurs in sense perception. Drawing from Berkeley’s Notebooks, Theory of Vision, and Principles, Hill adds his spin to Berkeley scholarship on how objects of sense are given unity and designated as “one thing” by a finite mind. He uses this unconscious volitional activity as evidence that mental activity is always present in sense perception even if Berkeley just so happened to have once claimed it did not. Hill treats Berkeley’s claim of passivity in perception as a blip in Berkeley’s overall philosophy that should be handled as more of a gradual unfolding of a more consistent theory of mind as Berkeley continues to flesh out his viewpoints. However, this account itself glosses over more issues than Hill brings to light. First, this was not a solitary instance of Berkeley claiming passivity in sense perception in an argument geared to disprove the existence of matter. Berkeley confirms the mind’s passivity in sense perception in a letter to Samuel Johnson on 24 March 1730 (PW 354). Though Hill may claim that Berkeley was still in a transitional phase 17 years after the first edition of the Dialogues, one wonders when these “transitions” really take place and how set they are given Hill’s own use of early works to expand Berkeley’s developed notion of activity in sense perception. Secondly, Hill’s analysis of mental activity in sense perception in judging and uniting various ideas of sense concerns only mediate sense perception, and he fails to realize that the controversy in question was never about that type of sense perception. Instead, it is in immediate sense perception, in the bare immediate reception of lights, colors, sounds, tastes, odors and tangibles as given sensibles, that Berkeley claims we are indeed passive (DHP 175).  Hill’s focus on how the mind is active in operating upon the sensibles it is given to unify them into the creation of one new idea misses what is active about the bare reception of those sensibles prior to their unification. Passivity in immediate sense perception, for Berkeley, is about what we are and are not causally responsible for. Hill concedes this, but does not offer a satisfactory account of the nuance of Berkeley’s position in all types of sense perception to unravel what truly may or may not be an inconsistency in his theory of mind. Highlighting all that he says elsewhere both before and after this exact passage doesn’t change the fact that, for Berkeley, a finite mind is passive in immediate sense perception, and the real issue is whether or not such an assertion violates his strict dualism. Though Hill may not delve into all the issues involved in sense perception, his expanded notion of activity in Berkeley continues to enrich his doctrine of notions and his laudable adherence to Berkeley’s ontological foundation.

Having shown how sense perception is an instance of conceptual dynamism where the mind actively sorts sensory input into unified objects according to conceptions of what objects are, Hill devotes his last few chapters to highlighting how effective his account of conceptual activity is in providing us a comprehensive understanding of Berkeley’s overall philosophy. His account of Berkeley’s doctrine of notions allows a deeper understanding of Berkeley’s moral concepts, mathematics, and knowledge of God’s nature. Hill remains true to Berkeley’s dualism in a way few scholars have, and allows the mind’s active nature to shape a systematic account of conceptualization. Concept formation and possession are, for Berkeley, a mental activity. Hill adeptly reveals Berkeley’s use of concepts as a way in which the mind knows how to employ its ideas rather than as a static viewing of an internal representation. Moral notions of justice and goodness are active dispositions rather than passive contemplations. Knowledge of goodness is the experience of being good known through good actions. On Hill’s model, Berkeley’s virtue and goodness are principles of action operating to persuade the mind to some appropriate action, disposition or emotion. Hill offers a number of persuasive examples from Alciphron, Siris, and even The Guardian demonstrating how moral concepts operate as an activating force for moral actions. Most interesting to his interpretation, Hill continues his cohesive, comprehensive view of how Berkeley’s treatment of morality stems from the active nature of spirit itself. He ends his account’s journey by demonstrating how even mathematics and our knowledge of the nature of God can be understood by an appeal to the simple, active, unified nature of the finite mind. The way in which the mind unifies disparate items, whether of sense or theoretical thought, stems from the mind’s simplicity and unity. For Hill and for Berkeley, it is the mind’s active, simple nature that makes number and mathematics possible. This inner finite nature is also what makes knowledge of the infinite being possible. Elevating and purifying the finite mind’s active powers, one may reach an immediate knowledge of the infinite mind through the nature of one’s own indivisible, simple nature. Hill’s insightful, layered account of Berkeley’s notion of good, number, and the divine nature genuinely captures the spirit of Berkeley’s spirit.

Ultimately, Hill’s use of Berkeley’s dualism as the grounding of a coherent, consistent interpretation of Berkeley’s doctrine of notions is a highly valuable addition to Berkeley scholarship. Drawing heavily on Siris as the culmination of Berkeley’s mature philosophy for this new interpretation increases our understanding of Berkeley’s overall philosophical tenets. Hill has achieved a fresh take that serves both Berkeley and those who would seek to understand him well. 


George Berkeley, Three Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous (1713) in The Works of George Berkeley, Bishop of Cloyne. 9 vols. Eds. A.A. Luce and T.E. Jessop. London: Thomas Nelson and Sons, 1948–57.  

George Berkeley, Philosophical Works, including the Works on Vision. Ed. Michael R. Ayers. London: J.M. Dent, 1992.