The Objects of Thought

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Tim Crane, The Objects of Thought, Oxford University Press, 2013, 182pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199682744.

Reviewed by Pierre Jacob, CNRS, Institut Jean Nicod, École Normale Supérieure


The specific goal of Tim Crane's elegant and original book is to offer a fresh solution to the problem: how can some of our thoughts about non-existent objects be true and others false? As it turns out, Crane's solution is openly psychologistic: the book purports to offer piece-meal psychological explanations of why and how humans sometimes entertain true thoughts about non-existent objects. Furthermore, Crane's appeal to psychologism (or psychological explanation) shows up in two specific unexpected areas: in his own explanation of what domains of quantification are and in his metaphysical distinction between substantial and pleonastic (or non-substantial) properties and relations.

This problem (henceforth, the problem of non-existence) arises in the context of Crane's overall goal, which is to reach a satisfactory account of the structure of human thought and intentionality. Following Brentano, Crane crucially assumes (as he makes fully explicit in chapter 4) that every psychological state involves an intentional content, an intentional mode and an intentional object. Some, but not all, of these intentional objects exist. Some thoughts about non-existent objects are true. Without a solution to the problem of non-existence, Crane contends that no account of intentionality can hope to be complete. Humans think about non-existent objects when, e.g., they make mistakes or create myths or fictions. In Crane's framework, even though empty terms (e.g., 'Vulcan' or 'Pegasus') fail to refer, one may nonetheless form true or false thoughts about Vulcan or Pegasus. In Crane's terminology, unlike aboutness, reference is a two-place relation between a word and some real existing thing. Crane further imposes two constraints on acceptable solutions to the problem of non-existence.

The first is the phenomenological constraint: we must be as faithful as possible to what we ordinarily take the objects of our thoughts to be -- the aboutness of human thoughts must be taken at face value. For example, an individual's thought (about a non-existing horse, e.g., Pegasus), her fear (of, e.g., dogs) and her desire (for, e.g., an inexpensive bottle of burgundy) are ordinarily construed as being about some object (or thing), not just some properties. The fact that the properties of the objects of our thoughts, fears or desires are not irrelevant to what we think, fear or desire does not show that our thoughts, fears and desires are not about the objects that instantiate those properties. As a result of his acceptance of the phenomenological constraint, Crane rejects the view that all thoughts about non-existent things are either false or devoid of truth-value. Thus, he rejects both the relational conception of intentionality and the conception of singular thoughts (thoughts about particular objects) construed as existence-dependent. In a nutshell, he parts company with philosophers who hold that the contents of all singular thoughts must be modeled by singular propositions (in Bertrand Russell's or David Kaplan's sense).

Secondly, Crane also accepts the reductionist constraint according to which truths about non-existent objects must be fully explainable in terms of truths about what exists. These reductive explanations are not translations or paraphrases of truths about non-existent objects; they are case-by-case descriptions of the psychological states or episodes on which these truths supervene. In a nutshell, for Crane to solve the problem of non-existence is to show that endorsement of his fundamental claim that there are truths about non-existent objects does not commit him to accepting non-existent objects in his ontology. Clearly, when an individual entertains a thought (or mental representation) about some non-existent object, the object need not exist, but the thought must. Thus, acceptance of the reductionist constraint paves the way for a psychologistic solution to the problem of non-existence.

In preparing the groundwork for his broadly psychologistic solution to the problem of non-existence, Crane must do two things, the first of which is to remove the logical and philosophical obstacles that lie in the way of his fundamental claim that there are truths about non-existent objects. According to Crane, the verb 'to exist' can be treated as a first-order predicate, but one obstacle to accepting his fundamental claim is the standard interpretation of the existential quantifier (inherited from Quine) that precludes quantification over non-existent things. For example, on the Quinean construal, the following particular instance of Crane's fundamental claim, as expressed by the English sentence "some characters in the Bible existed and some did not," turns out to be inconsistent -- something Crane of course cannot accept, since he takes the claim to be true. In chapter 2, he argues that the constitutive Quinean link between quantification and ontological commitment is revisionary. While Crane endorses a descriptive (i.e., non-revisionary) approach to the use of quantifiers in natural languages, he also embraces a psychologistic approach to the interpretation of domains of quantification. On Crane's descriptive approach to quantification in natural languages, the use of quantifiers lacks ontological import. Furthermore, Crane construes domains of quantification in psychological terms, i.e., in terms of mental representations or universes of discourse.

The second thing Crane does to prepare the grounds for his psychologistic solution to the problem of non-existence (in chapter 3) is to offer a basic metaphysical framework for addressing the fundamental difference between truths about existing and non-existing objects. The difference does not reflect a distinction between different meanings of 'true' or different properties expressible by the predicate 'true.' Instead, it lies in a distinction between two broad kinds of properties and relations: only existing things or objects can instantiate substantial or natural, i.e., existence-entailing, properties and relations (in David Armstrong's or David Lewis's sense). Non-existing things and objects can only instantiate non-substantial or pleonastic properties and relations (in Stephen Schiffer's sense), which are not existence-entailing. For example, the property of being a mythical horse is a pleonastic property. And so is the property of being a fictional detective. The former is instantiated by Pegasus, the latter by Sherlock Holmes.

Furthermore, Crane explains the contrast between pleonastic (or non-substantial) and non-pleonastic (or substantial) properties and relations in terms of representation-dependence. Something could not be a mythical horse unless it was represented as such in a myth. Nor could something be a fictional detective unless it was represented as such in a story. Because he holds that non-existent objects can only instantiate pleonastic properties and pleonastic properties are representation-dependent, Crane disagrees with the view (held by Meinong and his followers) that, in accordance with the so-called "principle of characterization," non-existent objects do instantiate all the properties they are represented as having. Sherlock Holmes is a fictional detective, not a (real) detective. Pegasus is a mythical horse, not a (real) horse. Vulcan is a postulated planet, not a (real) planet.

As is made clear in chapter 5, Crane's psychologistic solution aims at providing plausible piecemeal psychological explanations of the truths of thoughts about non-existent objects, not a single overarching psychological explanation for all truths about non-existent objects. Crane holds that almost all, but not all, properties of non-existent objects are representation-dependent pleonastic properties. Why not all? Because neither the property of non-existence itself nor the logical property of identity is a representation-dependent pleonastic property. On Crane's account, some truths about non-existent objects, including the truths of negative existential thoughts, are easier to account for than others. For example, the falsity of the thought expressed by 'Vulcan exists' "is ensured by the fact that reality -- everything that has existed and does exist -- does not contain Vulcan. And on reasonable assumptions, this ensures that its negation 'Vulcan does not exist' is true" (p. 119). Similarly, Crane's approach can easily account for the falsity of thoughts attributing non-pleonastic properties (being a horse, being a planet or being a detective) to non-existent objects (Pegasus, Vulcan or Sherlock Holmes). In chapter 6, in accordance with his reductionist constraint, Crane argues that identity proper holds only of existing objects. What is involved in the case of non-existent objects is intentional identity, and similarity of mental representations of (or mental files about) non-existent objects is sufficient to warrant intentional identity. For example, we count the Greek god Hermes as the same as the Roman god Mercury because the stories about them are relevantly similar. There is no further fact of the matter about the identity between Hermes and Mercury.

Crane's piecemeal psychologistic approach is best illustrated by his detailed accounts in chapter 5 of true thoughts about non-existent objects, in which the properties ascribed are pleonastic and not existence-entailing. Historians of science form many such true thoughts about non-existing things (Vulcan, phlogiston, the caloric), which have been mistakenly posited by scientists. For example, it is true that in 1859 Le Verrier postulated the planet Vulcan to explain the perturbations in the orbit of Mercury, using much the same methods as he had used in 1846 to introduce Neptune. But Le Verrier was wrong and, unlike Neptune, Vulcan does not exist. From Crane's psychologistic standpoint, what makes such historical claims true are Le Verrier's theoretical beliefs. One may therefore interpret such historical claims as containing the implicit operator 'in Le Verrier's theory.'

However, the implicit operator approach cannot be extended to true thoughts about mythical and fictional characters. For example, it is true that Sherlock Holmes is more famous than Sir Ian Blair and any other real detective living in the twentieth century. In Crane's psychologistic terminology, what makes this claim true is that Sherlock Holmes stands in the pleonastic relation of being more famous than to any detective living in the twentieth century, including Sir Ian Blair. It is also true that Pegasus is a mythological winged horse. What makes this claim true is that Pegasus has the pleonastic property of being a mythological winged horse. Thus, both claims are true in virtue of some representation-dependent relation or property. But it is not true in Conan Doyle's story that Sherlock Holmes is more famous than any real detective of the twentieth century, including Sir Ian Blair. Nor is it true in the Greek myth that Pegasus is a mythological winged horse. In chapter 5, Crane further elegantly dismisses the tempting view that what empty terms (e.g., 'Pegasus') refer to are representations. Representations do exist. So if 'Pegasus' did refer to a representation, then the negative existential thought expressed by 'Pegasus does not exist' would be false, not true. Instead, 'Pegasus' is an empty name devoid of reference. Still, one can think about Pegasus. To think that Pegasus is a horse is to entertain a false thought. But to think that Pegasus is a mythical horse is to entertain a true thought.

In accordance with the phenomenological constraint, true thoughts about non-existent objects must be construed as thoughts about particular objects, not merely about properties and relations. One burden of chapter 6 is to remove four main obstacles that lie on the way to the satisfaction of the phenomenological constraint. First, Crane distances himself from theories of direct reference by drawing a sharp dichotomy between what must be understood by a speaker who uses a name and semantic accounts of the contribution of a name to the truth-conditions of sentences containing it. Secondly, he denies that the fundamental nature of singular thoughts is to be found in their linguistic expressions. Thirdly, he argues against the view that the singularity of thoughts should be explained in terms of what can be known by acquaintance, thereby rejecting epistemological approaches to singular thoughts. Finally, he argues that while the distinction between de re and de dicto attributions of psychological states is completely uncontroversial, its application to psychological states themselves is not. He further argues that the singularity of a thought cannot depend on the way it is being ascribed (or described).

The other burden of chapter 6 is to offer a satisfactory psychological account of the specificity of thoughts about non-existent objects. Specific thoughts stand in contrast with general thoughts, whereby one thinks of objects as bearers of properties or relations. Specific thoughts can be about particular objects or pluralities thereof. A singular thought is a specific thought about a particular object. Crucially, in forming a singular thought, an individual purports to refer to some object. She may succeed or fail. If she fails, then her singular thought is about some non-existent object. Crane's favored psychological mechanism for forming singular thoughts about either existing or non-existent particular objects is the currently popular notion of mental files. But Crane rejects an epistemological approach to mental files that would require people to be acquainted (through perception) with the object the file is about. Instead, he espouses a purely psychological (or psychologistic) account of mental files, according to which Le Verrier did entertain a singular thought about Vulcan, even though his thought cannot be modeled by a singular proposition.

Thus, Crane's book refreshingly diverges from many prevalent views in current philosophy of mind and language. It is exposed, however, to two queries, the first of which is whether his solution to the problem of non-existence does not involve a vicious circle. Crane initially claims that no account of intentionality is possible without a solution to the problem of non-existence. But intentionality is at the core of his solution to the problem. As Crane recognizes at the end of the book (p. 168), this looks circular. Crane, however, denies that he is thereby committed to a vicious circle. I think he is right, but he does not explain why in much detail. I think he is right, because since his psychologistic view is that non-existent objects are by-products of intentionality, his task is to show that his theory of intentionality has the resources to offer plausible case-by-case psychological explanations of why some thoughts about non-existent objects are true and others false.

The second query is raised by the metaphysical asymmetry between Crane's reductionist attitude towards truths about non-existent objects and his non-reductionist attitude towards representations. As Crane observes (pp. 116-117), the world described by physics does not include mental representations. This is one basic reason why physicalists will not take mental representations for granted. Crane dismisses the physicalist metaphysical urge to define mental representations in non-semantic terms. But it is one thing to take for granted an individual's mental representations in the context of the psychological explanation of her behavior. It is another to take the notion of (shared) representation for granted and use it to draw a basic metaphysical distinction between natural (or substantial) non-pleonastic and pleonastic (non-natural) properties and relations.