The Ontological Argument from Descartes to Hegel

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Kevin J. Harrelson, The Ontological Argument from Descartes to Hegel, Humanity Books, 2009, $39.98 (hbk), ISBN 9781591026396.

Reviewed by Charles Taliaferro, St. Olaf College



In 1945, Bertrand Russell announced in his famous The History of Western Philosophy (a brilliant but sometimes eccentric and flawed book) that the ontological argument has been proved to be invalid, despite the fact that the soundness of the argument would be very good news indeed for philosophy:

The real question is: Is there anything we can think of which, by the mere fact that we can think of it, is shown to exist outside our thoughts. Every philosopher would like to say yes, because a philosopher’s job is to find out things about the world by thinking rather than observing.1

While Russell pronounced the argument dead (albeit with regret), perhaps Anthony Kenny was wiser in his four volume New History of Western Philosophy when he ended the fourth volume with a warning to those who think the argument has been refuted:

Plantinga’s reinstatement of the [ontological] argument, using logical techniques more modern than any available to Russell, serves as a salutary warning of the danger that awaits any historian of logic who declares a philosophical issue definitively closed.2

Kevin J. Harrelson has written a welcome historical and critical analysis of the ontological argument in early modern European philosophy. In the Introduction, he writes:

In the following chapters I argue that the strategy for proving a priori the existence of God that remains in place during this period, from Descartes’ initial argument in the Discourse on the Method (1637) to Hegel’s final lectures in Berlin (1831), is both internally consistent and free of any easily identifiable error. More importantly, I try to show that the most common objections to the modern ontological proof, raised by the likes of Gassendi, Hobbes, Hume, and Kant, fail to identify any conclusive and universal fallacy. (p. 18)

His book is not, however, “an outright defense of the ontological argument”, for Harrelson is convinced most versions of the ontological argument face serious obstacles and are not persuasive to those not already committed to what he finds philosophically problematic. The book is rich with historical references and nuanced readings of canonical texts, and is packed with arguments and counter-arguments.

The book opens with a compact overview of the ontological arguments found in Anselm, the scholastics, Descartes, and Leibniz. Some of the arguments’ exposition is a bit hard to follow. In discussing the relationship between perfection and necessary existence (which Anselmians usually seek to secure on the grounds that existing necessarily is a perfection or great-making attribute), Harrelson writes: “If God is indeed identical to his own existence, then it could only represent a shortcoming of human reason to distinguish the notion of a ‘perfect being’ from that of ‘necessary existence’” (p. 25). Why is this a problem? Can’t a case for the ontological argument begin with a consideration of great-making properties and an inquirer come to reason that necessary existence plus theistic attributes would be (or is) more excellent than theistic attributes and contingent existence? If one does not realize this prior to entertaining the argument, perhaps that is a “shortcoming”, but no worse than if someone did not realize 6 is the smallest perfect number before she reasoned that 6 is equivalent to 3 + 2+ 1.

In the same chapter, and on the same page as the claim just considered, Harrelson writes, “the peculiar identification of ‘God’ and ‘necessary existence’ renders misleading all theological statements about the existence of the deity” (p. 25). It is not clear, however, which philosopher (if any) claims that what we mean by “perfection” is “necessary existence” (as in “grandmother” is “a female whose child has a child”). Harrelson writes:

In early modern philosophy we find rather that theological propositions are understood to be akin to identical statements, and the philosophers in question fall just short of claiming that “perfect being” and “necessary existence” have the same meaning. “Necessary existence,” like God’s other predicates, is identical with God’s whole nature. This identity of subject and predicate would seem to exempt theological statements from the rules governing normal attributive statements. (p. 25)

Why, however, would a defender of the ontological argument claim that “necessary existence” means the same as “perfect being”, or claim that necessary existence “is identical with God’s whole nature”, rather than claim that necessary existence (or existing necessarily) is a mode of being distinct from being contingent (or having the property being contingent)? Presumably, for an Anselmian theist, claiming that God exists necessarily involves claiming that there necessarily exists a being of unsurpassable excellence or perfection. I do not yet see how linking necessity and perfection is a theological disaster. At the least, some clarification of how the thesis of divine simplicity comes into play on this issue would have been desirable.

In the same chapter, Harrelson has an interesting treatment of Descartes’ analogy about the idea of a triangle in discussing the idea of God. The format Harrelson employs in clarifying the points at issue is complex.

The following is a short list of those objections, other than the possibility and Thomistic, that are prevalent in the modern period. After each objection I give a caricature of the kind of reply that is frequently found among proponents of the modern argument. I also give a brief explanation of the debate, in which I try to indicate, very roughly, the historical contexts in which the respective objections and replies appear and reappear. (p. 29)

The deliberate use of caricature made the reasoning less easy to follow (for me, anyway).

True to his claim not to be offering “an outright defense” of the ontological argument, here is Harrelson’s conclusion from the Introduction:

In any case, the arguments of even the most consistent proponents are ridden with philosophical difficulties. Chief among these is the problem that many ontological arguments from Descartes to Hegel concern not only the existence of God, but also our experience and/or intuition of perception inhibits, in many cases, the communication and exposition of the alleged “insight” into the unity of God’s essence and existence. The Cartesian ontological argument, like the various rationalist systems that support and elaborate it, suffers from a corresponding shortage of credibility, which likely would have been enough to bring about its downfall in the absence of any other objections. (p. 34)

Thus, the problem with the argument is that it involves the existence of God (!), experience and/or intuition (perhaps especially theological intuition), and insight. One difficulty readers will have so far is that it is not easy to see “the downfall” of the argument without seeing more of “the rise”.

The next chapter begins with the problem facing Descartes’ version of the argument due to his use of geometry as an analogy. Harrelson has a helpful analysis of some of the philosophical dynamics between Descartes and his objectors. Harrelson’s criticism of the Cartesian argument is that it fails because of its reliance on an interlocutor perceiving that if there is a supremely perfect being, this being would exist necessarily. He then concludes that the ontological argument is sometimes unsound because some interlocutors lack the appropriate perception. Harrelson writes:

First, from the fact that our perception is incorporated in the premise of the argument it follows that the conclusion is not true for everyone. In other words, whoever does not actually perceive the connection between “a supremely perfect being” and “necessary existence” cannot assent to the claim in the minor premise, in which case the conclusion remains undemonstrated. It is not the case that these individuals fail to grasp a premise that is objectively true; rather, their perceiving a certain “truth” is itself part of the premise. The premise is in fact false in any instance in which the perception is lacking. The ontological argument is thus unsound in those cases. Regardless of whether the ontological argument is ever sound, then, it will sometimes be unsound. The objections will always be, in some sense, in the right, despite their inability to discover an internal flaw in the argument. (p. 67)

This strikes me as odd. Any argument in philosophy might well be considered unsound if not everyone grasps its entailment relations. Even a simple entailment like “if all humans are mortal, no immortal being is a human” might sometimes be unsound because someone, somewhere does not accept the entailment.

In “Refutation of Atheism”, there is a welcome discussion of Cambridge Platonist treatments of the ontological argument. Harrelson has some sympathy with Henry More and Ralph Cudworth, even if he thinks both present arguments with fatal flaws or fail to persuade. As before, I find Harrelson’s autopsy of the argument neither obvious or clear. Here is an analysis of More:

Like Descartes, [More] assents to the following maxim: "we are first to have a settled notion of what God is, before we go about to demonstrate that he is." The various subsidiary arguments to the minor premise (the proof of innateness, the deduction of necessary existence from the idea of God, etc.) serve this end, comprising a preliminary examination of the essence or notion of God. The inference to God’s actual existence appears only at the end of this discussion. This last fact, however, represents the fatal consequence of the systematic presentation of the ontological argument: in order to clarify the various steps in the argument, it was necessary to distinguish the essence of God (i.e., “what God is”) from his existence (“that he is”). The systematic presentation of the ontological argument thereby contradicts the basic presupposition of that same argument, viz., that the essence and existence of God are inseparable. (pp. 87-88)

I do not quite see the problem. More does not think God’s essence and existence can be metaphysically separated, but he thinks one can epistemically consider God’s essence and then come to see that it (together with the thesis that God exists either necessarily or God’s existence is impossible, plus the premise that God’s existence is possible) entails that God exists.

Harrelson offers a helpful exposition of the work of Ralph Cudworth and Samuel Clark. He is probably correct that Locke’s attack on innate ideas undermined the popularity of the ontological argument, though there are many versions of the argument that do not require or presuppose the existence of innate ideas.

In the chapter “Being and Intuition”, Harrelson takes up the work of Malebranche. There is a useful examination of how Malebranche advances the ontological argument beyond Descartes. At least one of Harrelson’s objections to Malebranche seems strained: “the revised form of the argument is indefensible against the nominalist’s objection that ‘being’ is a mere concept” (p. 115). It is indefensible, unless of course nominalism turns out to be deeply problematic and then the objection carries no weight.

Chapter four contains a helpful analysis of Spinoza’s work, showing how his version of the ontological argument is closely tied in with the whole of Spinoza’s philosophy: "No one can accept [Spinoza’s] argument without accepting his other doctrines in toto, or at least without offering alternative versions of them." (p. 135)

Chapter five offers a detailed exploration of the ontological argument in pre-Kantian German philosophy. Arguments by Leibniz, Wolff, Baumgarten, and Crusius are addressed.

Chapter six on Kant is excellent. Harrelson places Kant’s famous criticism of the ontological argument in perspective and shows why it is not decisive. Harrelson thinks Kant was effective in challenging the authority of the ontological argument largely because of Kant’s general case about the limits of human thought:

The ontological argument, in 1785, is still not the object of any directly successful critique. Its temporary disappearance is a product only of the belief that humans are incapable of obtaining any genuine cognition beyond the field of “experience,” as this term is defined in the opening chapters of the Critique of Pure Reason. (p. 191)

The final chapter on Hegel provides a good context for Harrelson’s thesis that the ontological argument might work for some people. If one can (in Hegel’s terms) “elevate” one’s mind to God, the argument succeeds:

Whoever “grasps” or comprehends that “being is the concept,” i.e., whoever gazes from the summit of absolute knowledge and thereby understands the inferences of Hegelian logic, also perceives the existence of God via participation in God’s self-knowledge. (p. 220)

In Harrelson’s view, while (to echo Russell) every philosopher would like to have such elevation, few of us succeed and so Hegel’s ontological argument (like Descartes’) fails in its ambition as a demonstration or proof.

For those of us who are drawn to the ontological argument and have lower standards than Harrelson (who are content to find “good arguments”, rather than obvious proofs), Harrelson’s book contains a positive, historical exposition of the arguments’ strengths. While some of Harrelson’s objections do not seem (to me) to have as much force as he thinks, the overall historical and critical analysis is engaging and well-informed by scholarship; it makes a great contribution to the history of ideas and the philosophy of religion. The book contains a useful glossary of arguments, terms and positions.

1 Russell, Bertrand, The History of Western Philosophy, Simon & Schuster, Inc., 1972, p. 417

2 Kenney, Anthony, A New History of Western Philosophy, vol IV. Oxford University Press, 2007, p. 318