The Ontology of Time

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L. Nathan Oaklander, The Ontology of Time, Prometheus Books, 2004, 366pp, $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 1591021979 .

Reviewed by Thomas Crisp, Florida State University


Nathan Oaklander has for years been a central player in the debate between so-called A-theorists and B-theorists about time. This a collection of his essays on that topic going back to the early eighties. It's an excellent collection, full of interesting and subtle arguments, a must read for anyone interested in the state of the art in contemporary philosophy of time.

The collection has four major parts. The first part comprises three essays in which Oaklander explains the debate between the A-theorists and the B-theorists and argues that McTaggart's paradox makes trouble for A-theorists.

The second part consists of eleven essays in which Oaklander mounts a sustained attack against three major versions of the A-theory: presentism, the view that only present things exist; the so-called "growing block" view, on which there are past and present things but no future things; and the hybrid A/B view, on which spatiotemporal reality (a) comprises past, present and future entities related to one another by the primitive, B-theoretic temporal relations earlier/later than and simultaneous with, and (b) undergoes A-theoretic temporal becoming as its constituent parts are successively characterized by the primitive, A-theoretic properties being past, being present and being future.

The third part comprises eleven essays in which Oaklander defends the B-theory against the objections that (a) it cannot account for our experience of temporal becoming and the difference in our attitudes toward past, present and future, and (b) an adequate semantical treatment of tensed language requires an A-theoretic ontology. He proposes that B-theorists can give a perfectly adequate account of our experience of time and our differing attitudes toward past, present and future, and that the so-called new B-theory of language can be defended against objections recently put against it by inter alia Quentin Smith and William Lane Craig.

The fourth and final part comprises five essays in which Oaklander treats the connection between the A-theory/B-theory debate and other topics in philosophy, including personal identity, moral responsibility, divine foreknowledge and freedom. It concludes with a nice defense of the B-theory against the oft-made (and, I think, misguided) charge that a B-theoretic ontology is incompatible with the existence of human freedom.

A central theme running through these essays is that McTaggart's paradox renders the various A-theoretic views of time untenable. A few comments about that. McTaggart's celebrated paradox presents the observer of contemporary philosophy of time with a puzzling state of affairs. On the one hand, you've able philosophers -- inter alia Oaklander and Mellor --claiming that McTaggart has shown irrefragably that A-theoretic views of time are incoherent; on the other, you've able philosophers -- inter alia Broad, Prior, Chisholm, and more recently, Sider, himself no friend of the A-theory -- who think of McTaggart's argument as manifestly bad, a "howler" even. Strange.

So why does Oaklander think that McTaggart's paradox makes trouble for A-theoretic views of time? Well, you get a slightly different answer depending on the version of the A-theory at issue, but the same basic themes recur. So that we can get a feel for those themes, let me get a version of presentism on the table, one closely connected to a version defended by William Lane Craig and critiqued by Oaklander in Essays 6, 7 and 8 of the volume. Then I'll say something about why Oaklander thinks it runs afoul of McTaggart.

Presentism, roughly, is the view that everything is present. Less roughly, it's the view that, it's always the case that, quantifying unrestrictedly, nothing is at any temporal distance from anything. (I leave undefined the notion of temporal distance in play here, though the intuitive idea should be clear enough. If our most inclusive domain of quantification includes past as well as present entities, it presumably includes Lincoln's assassination. Suppose so. Then the temporal distance between his assassination and the present is a bit less than 140 years.)

So presentism: nothing is at any temporal distance from anything; it always has and always will be this way. But, one wonders, what is meant by 'always' here? We could give the standard answer in terms of the tense operators of orthodox tense logics like Prior's, but then we'd be left with the question of what the presentist means by the tense operators. Oaklander, rightly in my view, complains that there is something deeply unsatisfying about versions of presentism that invoke primitive tense operators and then say nothing about the ontology that underlies them. So, he wants to know, what is the ground or truthmaker for statements of the form 'WAS(S)'? What is the bit of reality that makes it true, say, that WAS(dinosaurs exist)? I agree with Oaklander that these questions need an answer; here is one way of answering them.

Let us join Prior, Chisholm, Zalta and others in thinking of a "time" as certain sort of abstract object. A time, let us say, is any proposition that satisfies the following schema:

x is a time =df. For some class C of propositions such that C is maximal and consistent, x is the proposition that y(yC y is true),

where (i) a class C of propositions is maximal iff, for every proposition p, either p or its denial is a member of C, (ii) a class C of propositions is consistent iff, possibly, every member of C is true, and (iii) all verbs in the schema are tenseless.

We can use these abstract times to give a presentist friendly account of the tense operators. Here's a bare bones sketch. Just as modal metaphysicians take there to be a logical accessibility relation connecting possible worlds, we might suppose there is a temporal accessibility relation connecting certain of the abstract times -- a primitive, unanalyzable relation on abstract times that is transitive, irreflexive and asymmetrical and orders the times (better: some of the times) into an "ersatz" B-series representing the history of the world.

Three comments about this ersatz B-series. First. It's abstract: it's members are abstract times at no spatial or temporal distance from anything. Second. One and only one time in the series is true: the "present" time. Times that are "later than" the present time (i.e., accessible from it) represent how things will be; times that are "earlier than" the present time (i.e. such that the present time is accessible from them) represent how things were. Third. It's a brute fact that times are connected up in the way they are by the temporal accessibility relation. Pick two times t1 and t2 in the ersatz B-series and there's this question: why does t1 bear the is temporally accessible from relation to t2? On the view presently under consideration, the answer is: it just does. (Just as, for many B-theorists, the answer to the question why concrete time t1 bears the B-theorists' version of the earlier than relation to concrete time t2 is: it just does.)

Thus armed, we can give a presentist friendly account of the tense operators, as follows. 'WAS(x)' and 'WILL(x)', we can suppose, are predicates, expressions that combine with a singular term t to yield a sentence that expresses a proposition about the referent of t. Both predicates, we can suppose, express properties. The property being present, we can say, is just the property being true -- the property a proposition has iff it is true. 'WAS(x)', then, expresses the property being past, the property a proposition has iffdf. it is true at a time earlier than whatever time happens to be the present time -- i.e., iff it is entailed by a time in the ersatz B-series earlier than the present time. Mutatis mutandis with 'WILL(x)'.

We can also say something about how the presentist will understand talk of presentness "moving" along the series of times. (What I'll say, though, is very nearly vacuous. Such, I think, is the nature of temporal becoming: it admits of no very informative explanation.) Say henceforth that the expression got by enclosing a sentence S in square brackets is an abbreviation for the expression consisting of ‘the proposition that’ followed by S. So, e.g., ‘[John is tall]’ abbreviates ‘the proposition that John is tall’. Say too that, henceforth, underlined verbs and copulae are tenseless. (A quick note about this. As I'm thinking of things, a tenseless predication of the form 'x is F' predicates F-ness of x, but indicates nothing about when x has F-ness. This as opposed to 'x is (present tense) F', and 'x is now F', which, arguably, indicate relative to a context of utterance C that x has F-ness at the time of utterance in C. Note well that to say of a predication that it's tenseless is not to say that it is always true if true or always false if false. Presentists who think there are such things as tenseless predications will think of them as changing their truth values over time: e.g., [Bush is president] was false, is now true, and will be false again.) Then on the version of presentism under consideration, to say that presentness moves along the ersatz B-series is to say something like this:

(*) The B-series is such that (i) one and only one of its members tα has the property being present, (ii) for every time t1 in the series such that t1 is earlier than tα, WAS[t1 has being present], and (iii) for every time t2 in the series such that t2 is later than tα, WILL[t2 has being present].

So far, then, a version of presentism, one similar in many ways to the versions critiqued by Oaklander in Essays 6, 7 and 8. Let us look now into one of his chief complaints, that presentism runs afoul of McTaggart.

If I'm following, his argument will go something like this. If there is temporal becoming in the sense that the property being present moves along the members of the ersatz B-series, then it follows that every term in the series has each of the properties being past, being present and being future, something that, given the above characterization of these properties, is manifestly impossible. On the other hand, if each of the terms in the series has only one of the properties being past, being present and being future, then being present does not move along the members of the B-series and there's no temporal becoming, no A-theoretic temporal passage, no tensed time. But the latter option won't do -- presentism without A-theoretic temporal becoming is a poor thing. So our presentist looks to be stuck with the unfortunate consequence that, on her view, every term in the ersatz B-series has each of the properties being past, being present and being future (henceforth, "the A-properties"), a manifest impossibility. So much the worse for our presentist.

Similar reasoning recurs again and again in Oaklander's critiques of the various versions of the A-theory. I find it puzzling though. First, I don't understand why we should think it follows from the claim that the property being present moves along the members of the B-series that every term in the series has each of the A-properties. To say that presentness "moves" along the members of the B-series is to say what is said by (*). But I don't see any reason for thinking it follows from (*) that every time in the series has each of the A-properties. Pick two times t1 and t2 such that t2 is later than t1 and suppose that t1 has being present and that WILL[t2 has being present]. Oaklander's argument seems to presuppose that a proposition like [t1 has being present and WILL[t2 has being present]] is true only if the relevant t1 and t2 both have being present. But why think that? Imagine someone trying to argue against actualism in the same vein. Actualists, they say, hold that one and only one world W1 has the property being actual but that for some distinct world W2 logically accessible from W1, POSS[W2 has being actual]. But this won't do, says our objector, because if W1 has being actual and POSS[W2 has being actual], then, contrary to actualism, both W1 and W2 have being actual. This isn't an impressive objection to actualism. But is it interestingly different than objecting to presentism by claiming that if (*) is true, then every abstract time has each of the A-properties?

Second, I don't understand why we should think that if each of the terms in the ersatz B-series has only one of the A-properties, then being present does not move along the members of the B-series and there is no temporal becoming, no tensed time. Why think this? There's temporal becoming, movement of the NOW across the members of the B-series, iff (*) is true. But, so far as I can see, (*) is perfectly compatible with its being the case that each of the terms in the ersatz B-series has only one of the A-properties.

Oaklander says things that suggest maybe he's thinking that, for any x, if x is F -- where the underlined copula, remember, indicates that it is tenseless -- then it's always the case that x is F. Tenseless predications, on this view, are not the sorts of things that can change truth value over time. Suppose they aren't. Then if, as (*) says, one and only one time has being present, it will always have being present, and there's no temporal becoming. But I can't see that there's any reason for thinking that tenseless predication behaves in this way. Consider the tenseless predication 'Smarty Jones is a horse'. It is plausibly thought of as indicating the existence of a two-term connection between Smarty and the property being a horse as opposed to a three-term connection between Smarty, being a horse, and some time or other. Were eternalism true and presentism false -- i.e., were reality spread out in time as well as space, comprising past, present and future entities -- 'Smarty Jones is a horse', I should think, would be true relative to any time of utterance: utter the sentence whenever you like, and given eternalism, its subject term designates something -- viz., Smarty -- located in the past, present or future and connected by the two-term having relation to the property being a horse. Given presentism, though, the right thing to think about 'Smarty Jones is a horse', I think, is that it is true but will, when Smarty dies, go false. At any rate, I can't see any reason why a presentist shouldn't think this way about tenseless predication. Consequently, I can't see why we should endorse the principle expressed by the first sentence of this paragraph.

I doubt, then, that Oaklander's version of McTaggart's paradox makes any serious trouble for the version of presentism adumbrated above. There are various sensible complaints one could make about this version of presentism -- that it gives no informative explanation of temporal becoming, for instance -- but that it founders on McTaggart's paradox, so it seems to me, isn't one of them. And since the above presentism is a not-too-distant cousin of the presentisms considered by Oaklander in Essays 6, 7 and 8, I'm convinced that the same goes for them.

Be that as it may, I've merely scratched the surface of Oaklander's critique of the A-theory and haven't talked at all about his defense of the B-theory. His arguments on both fronts are complex and penetrating.