The Opacity of Mind: An Integrative Theory of Self-Knowledge

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Peter Carruthers, The Opacity of Mind: An Integrative Theory of Self-Knowledge, Oxford University Press, 2011, 437pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199596195.

Reviewed by Alex Byrne, Massachusetts Institute of Technology


The Opacity of Mind is a terrific book. In a nutshell, the plot is this: Gilbert Ryle meets contemporary cognitive science, and together they produce a novel and exciting theory of self-knowledge. That might seem an improbable partnership, but the book shows that the two were made for each other.

The Rylean heir

In chapter 6 of The Concept of Mind, Ryle turns to self-knowledge. On Ryle's account,

The sort of things I can find out about myself are the same as the sorts of things I can find out about other people, and the methods of finding them out are much the same . . . in principle, as distinct from practice, John Doe's ways of finding out about John Doe are the same as John Doe's ways of finding out about Richard Roe (Ryle 1949: 155-6, my emphasis).

With respect to self-knowledge, Carruthers is Ryle's heir. On his Interpretive Sensory-Access (ISA) theory, our "self-knowledge abilities . . . result merely from turning our mindreading capacities on ourselves" (5). Our access to our own minds "is no different in principle from our access to the mental states of other people" (1).

On Ryle's view, sometimes self-knowledge is easier to obtain than knowledge of the mental states of others, but not always:

A residual difference in the supplies of the requisite data make some differences in degree between what I can know about myself and what I can know about you, but these differences are not all in favor of self-knowledge. In certain quite important respects it is easier for me to find out what I want to know about you than it is for me to find out the same sorts of things about myself. In certain other respects it is harder. (Ryle 1949: 155-6)

And similarly for Carruthers:

It is important to note that while the ISA theory allows that there is often more evidence available for interpretation in the first person than in the third, this doesn't necessarily entail an increase in reliability. For sometimes the presence of more data doesn't lead to more reliable conclusions. (24)

Going by the quotations from Ryle, his view can appear obviously absurd. I might have to take note of the ways I have behaved in order to find out that I am vain and cowardly, but I don't have to observe my behavior to know that I'm thinking about the weather. However, despite the common caricature of Ryle as a crude behaviorist, his position is considerably more subtle. I can come to know what you are thinking by hearing you speak; likewise, according to Ryle, I can come to know what I am thinking by being aware of my inner speech, or "silent soliloquy". And Carruthers agrees: on his view, inner speech is "an important source of evidence" about our own thoughts (5).

Ryle's and Carruthers's claim that our access to our own minds is "no different in principle" than our access to the minds of others is thus in one respect a slight exaggeration. In the case of knowledge of one's thoughts, inner speech plays a crucial role, and of course one has a special kind of access to one's own inner speech. Still, that doesn't spoil the basic picture, because one's inner speech is supposed to be evidence of one's thoughts for basically the same reasons that someone's outer speech is evidence of her thoughts.

What about bodily sensations and perception? Surely I don't know that I feel an itch, or see a duck, in the same way I know that you feel an itch, or see a duck! Ryle does not explicitly address this issue, but Carruthers is quite clear that these cases are exceptions. Restoring an elision in a quotation given above, Carruthers's considered view is that "our mode of access to the non-sensory aspects of our own minds is no different in principle from our access to the mental states of other people" (1, my emphasis).

This might sound like an inelegantly disunified account of self-knowledge, but it turns out that our third-person mindreading system is also implicated in our knowledge of the "sensory aspects" of our own minds -- a point I shall come back to. (Carruthers discusses the mindreading system at length in chapter 8; that chapter deserves a review all by itself. For present purposes I will assume that Carruthers's positive assessment of the evidence for a mindreading system is correct.)

Transparency and opacity

Carruthers opposes the ISA theory to what he calls 'transparent-access' accounts. According to the ISA theory, we do not enjoy "transparent access" to "the non-sensory aspects of our own minds". So what is "transparent access"?

As Carruthers explains early on, "the term 'transparent' will be used throughout this book, in a semi-technical sense, to mean 'access to mental states that isn't interpretive'" (8). (This is not how the term is used in much of the self-knowledge literature, notably Moran 2001. This will be touched on in the next section.)

What is access that is interpretive? Carruthers's most explicit statement is not in the book, but in an earlier Behavioral and Brain Sciences paper:

For present purposes, an interpretative process . . . is one that accesses information about the subject's current circumstances, or the subject's current or recent behavior, as well as any other information about the subject's current or recent mental life. For this is the sort of information that we must rely on when attributing mental states to other people. (Carruthers 2009: 123; cf. The Opacity of Mind, 19, 163, 215)

Abbreviating knowledge of the subject's "current circumstances . . . current or recent behavior" (etc.) as background knowledge, transparent access may be loosely characterized as follows: one has transparent access to mental states of kind M iff one has the capacity to know that one is in mental states of kind M without relying on background knowledge. If one has only has the capacity to know that one is in mental states of kind M by relying on background knowledge, then one has non-transparent, or opaque, access to mental states of kind M.

For a reason that will become clear in a moment, alternative terminology is better: let us use 'non-interpretive access' (as Carruthers sometimes does) for what he mostly calls 'transparent access'; similarly, 'non-transparent access' will be relabeled 'interpretive access'.

Is there a connection between non-interpretive access and the common idea that our access to our own minds is somehow epistemically superior to our access to others' minds? Using a piece of Rylean terminology, let us say that we have privileged access to mental states of kind M iff our beliefs that we are in these states are more likely to amount to knowledge than our beliefs that others are in them, when those beliefs are arrived at by the usual route. Privileged access clearly comes in degrees. (I think this is the most natural way to use this terminology, but unfortunately different writers use it differently, including Ryle and Carruthers.[1]) Does non-interpretive access entail privileged access, or vice versa?

No: clearly the two kinds of access are independent. That one has non-interpretive access to one's mental states is consistent with one's beliefs about one's (present) mental states being mostly false. The capacity to know one's mental life without relying on background knowledge might be very difficult to exercise.

Here's another way of making the point. In an extension of the 'non-interpretive' terminology, we enjoy non-interpretive access to many aspects of our environment through perception. For example, by vision one can know that an object is red, or moving, or dimpled, without relying on collateral information about the object's recent history, or whether it is a strawberry. But of course this fact is consistent with widespread perceptual error. Conversely, that one has privileged access to one's mental states is consistent with having interpretive access -- for example, the relevant background knowledge might be much easier to obtain in one's own case.

Now there is one qualification to this two-way independence. Suppose one held the strongest version of privileged access, namely that our beliefs about our mental states are infallible: if one believes one is in a mental state (of kind M), then one knows that one is in that mental state. The infallibility thesis is incompatible with interpretive access. If we have interpretive access, then presumably the background assumptions on which we rely will sometimes fail to be knowledge. And if they do sometimes fail to be knowledge, then sometimes one will believe one is a mental state without knowing that one is, and so infallibility will not hold.

It appears that Carruthers might have slightly misled himself (or at any rate might have misled a few readers) by his use of 'transparent' to mean 'non-interpretive'. In Chapter 2, he tries to "explain away the intuition that our own thoughts and thought processes are transparently accessible to us" (32). But what he tries to explain away, in the first instance, is why people are naturally drawn to a "Cartesian epistemology of mind" (13), which includes the infallibility thesis or at any rate something close to it (see, e.g., 12). The purported explanation is fascinating in its own right (and can't be examined here for reasons of space); the present point is that Carruthers chiefly attempts to explain away our attraction to a claim -- the infallibility claim, more or less -- that entails that we have non-interpretive access to our own minds. And this, of course, is not necessarily to explain away our attraction to non-interpretive access itself: if we are attracted to it, it might be for other reasons. What's more, once it's clear what non-interpretive access actually amounts to, it is quite doubtful that this is something that the man on the Clapham omnibus might be expected to have an opinion about. That is, the belief that we enjoy non-interpretive access to "our own thoughts" is not a good candidate for (in Carruthers's phrase) a "human universal" (25). Perhaps belief in (something in the vicinity of) the infallibility thesis is universal, and as noted the infallibility thesis entails that we enjoy non-interpretive access, but we should not expect our man on the bus to recognize the entailment.

To see that the issue of interpretive versus non-interpretive access is over the heads of the proletariat, consider Carruthers's account of the epistemology of thought. Roughly speaking, according to Carruthers one knows what one is thinking by "hearing" one's inner speech. Further, according to Carruthers, comprehension of one's inner speech and comprehension of the outer speech of another person involves the same mechanisms (perhaps slightly tweaked). And since, for Carruthers, speech comprehension is a paradigm case of "interpretation", this is why, on his view, knowledge of one's thoughts involves interpretation too. So that's what Carruthers means by saying that we have "non-interpretive" access to our thoughts. Is our man on the Clapham omnibus supposed to find this "unintuitive"? Presumably he would get off at the next stop, telling us not to pester him with our fancy theories. But this is all minor quibbling. Before turning to something meatier, let me quibble a little more.

Elaborating on what I have already briefly mentioned, Carruthers thinks that we only have interpretive (or "non-transparent") access to our "active, occurrent thoughts like judgments and decisions" and "standing attitudes such as beliefs and intentions" (119). However, he thinks we have non-interpretive (or "transparent") access to our "sensory states" (perceptual states, imagistic states), as well as to certain states that involve affect, such as "current feelings of wanting or liking" (135).

This makes the -- admittedly sexy -- title of the book potentially misleading, for two reasons. First, Carruthers thinks that a large chunk of the mind is transparent, not opaque. And, second, 'The Opacity of Mind' conjures up an image of one's mind seen through a glass, darkly. But that is not of the essence of the ISA theory at all, as I understand it. Although the ISA theory is incompatible with the infallibility thesis, that thesis is usually held to be implausible on a number of grounds. A significant degree of privileged access is the most that can be hoped for, and the ISA theory is perfectly compatible with that.

Knowledge of sensory states, and "integration"

Let me now turn to a much more substantive issue, Carruthers's account of our knowledge of our "sensory or sensory-involving states, which include seeing, hearing, feeling, and so on, as well as imagistic versions of the same types of experience" (xi). He doesn't devote much time in the book to this, because, as he explains in the preface, "like most theories in the field, the model of self-knowledge that I present regards our awareness of these types of state as being relatively unproblematic" (xi). I do not know why Carruthers thinks that "most theories" regard self-knowledge of perceptual states as "unproblematic", but in any case, how does Carruthers propose to explain it?

In effect, Carruthers's explanation is a version of a familiar approach one can find suggested -- if not explicitly laid out -- in Evans's The Varieties of Reference. As Carruthers puts it, "self-knowledge can be reliably acquired from knowledge of the world as it presents itself to the subject" (77). 'Transparency' is typically used to label this idea (as I have mentioned, Carruthers's usage is different). Most of the literature on this concerns belief, but Carruthers thinks that this is where the transparency account doesn't work. (More on that in a moment.) Rather, he thinks, "Such an account is correct for self-knowledge of experience" (79).

Here's one way of putting the basic idea. In central cases, one comes to know that one is in a mental state S by an inference from world to mind: an inference from a premise that typically has nothing to do with oneself or one's mental states, to the conclusion that one is in S. Belief is the simplest case. Here the inference is:

1.     p.

2.     So, I believe that p.

This is what Gallois (1996) calls the doxastic schema. (In Byrne 2005 this is put -- entirely equivalently -- in terms of an "epistemic rule": 'If p, believe that you believe that p'.) An instance of the doxastic schema is:

1.     Carruthers was born in Uganda.

2.     So, I believe that Carruthers was born in Uganda.

How might this work for perception, in particular for the state of seeing an F? Carruthers's answer is displayed in the following passages:

It is obvious why the mindreading system should have access to vision and audition. For to interpret the intentions behind a smile, or a gesture, or a spoken phrase, the mindreading system would need access to perceptual representations that encode that smile, or gesture, or phrase. And in that case, a mindreading system that has access to the concepts of seeing and hearing . . . should be capable of self-attributing the perceptual states in question . . . Receiving as input a visual representation of a person smiling, for example, the mindreading system should be capable of forming the judgment, I AM SEEING A PERSON SMILING. Everyone should predict, therefore, that people have transparent, non-interpretive, access to their own perceptual and imagistic states. (51, footnote omitted)


if the content that is accessible to mindreading is red tomato there . . . then the mindreading faculty is in a position to recognize, on the basis of properties of the content itself, that one is seeing a red tomato. Neither inner sense nor interpretation are needed. (80)

If we assume that Carruthers cashes out the Evans-inspired approach as an inference from world to mind, then a first-pass example of the relevant inference is this:

1.     There is a red tomato there.

2.     So, I see a red tomato.

Two problems are immediately apparent. First, to borrow a word from Matt Boyle, the inference is obviously "mad" (Boyle 2011: 227), in the sense that the premise is not good evidence for the conclusion. Of course this problem also afflicts the belief case: that Carruthers was born in Uganda is no evidence that I believe that he was. Actually it's no evidence for anything, since Carruthers was not born in Uganda. Nonetheless, on the view defended in Byrne 2005, someone may acquire knowledge that she believes that Carruthers was born in Uganda by reasoning from the false premise that Carruthers was born in Uganda. (This example shows that Carruthers's characterization of the world-to-mind account as the acquisition of self-knowledge "from knowledge of the world" is not fully general, since of course falsehoods are not known.)

The second problem is peculiar to perception: why does the premise somehow indicate that I bear a visual relation to the tomato? For example, I might believe the premise because I can feel a ripe (hence red) tomato in my hand: if I conclude that I see a red tomato I will be wrong.

Now Carruthers does have something to say about the second problem (see 74-5; there's a hint of this in the quotation above, about being in a position to recognize that one is seeing a red tomato "on the basis of the properties of the content itself"). Carruthers remarks here are insightful, although it would be a distraction to get into the details. (For some of them seeByrne 2011.) The present point, rather, is that Carruthers seriously underplays the difficulties with the world-to-mind approach, which is anyway extremely controversial.

The second point is that it is unclear why Carruthers maintains that the third-person mindreading system is implicated in these world-to-mind inferences. There is a confused line of thought that might lead one to think that the mindreading system is implicated, which makes an appearance in the book in the guise of an objection to the ISA theory. Carruthers does not endorse the confused line of thought, but since he doesn't actually point out the confusion, it's worth mentioning.

Here's the objection, as Friedman and Petrashek put in a commentary on Carruthers's 2009 Behavioral and Brain Sciences paper:

Mindreading often requires access to one's own beliefs. Consider the following mental state [attribution] . . . Louise is an expert in British history, so she knows that the Battle of Hastings occurred in 1066 . . . [this attribution] primarily depend[s] on your beliefs (i.e., . . . the Battle of Hastings occurred in 1066) . . . in combination with other principles (e.g., experts in British history know a lot about British history) . . .

The mindreading system's access to beliefs is problematic for Carruthers' account of metacognition, which denies such access . . . For if the system accesses beliefs when attributing mental states to others, then it should also access them when attributing mental states to the self. For instance, if the mindreading system accesses the belief "the Battle of Hastings occurred in 1066" when attributing it to Louise the historian, then the system should also be able to attribute this belief to the self. The mindreading system's access to beliefs allows people to engage in non-interpretative metacognition. (Friedman and Petrashek 2009: 146)

And here's Carruthers's summary of the objection:

The objection is that the mindreading system needs to have access to the agent's own beliefs in order to do its interpretive work, in which case self-attributing beliefs should be just as trivially easy as self-attributing experiences. (236-7)

According to Friedman and Petrashek, if the third-person mindreading system "has access" to mental states of kind M, then the mindreading system can deliver knowledge that the subject herself is in a mental state of kind M, without reliance on interpretation. If that's right, and if the mindreading system has access to perceptual states (as Carruthers thinks it does), then it supplies self-knowledge of perceptual states. Hence the epistemology of thought and the epistemology of perception, despite being quite different -- the first involves interpretation while the second doesn't -- are nonetheless unified. The mindreading system is centrally involved in both.

The mistake here lies in the phrase 'access to one's perceptual state'. That could mean access to information about one's perceptual state -- say, that one sees a red tomato. And if it does mean that, then the argument for integration just given is virtually irresistible. But there is an alternative: 'access to one's perceptual state' could mean access to information about one's environment, supplied by perception -- say, that there is a red tomato there. Similarly for 'access to one's beliefs', where the ambiguity is clearer: that could mean access to the factthat one believes that it's raining, or it could mean access to what one believes, namely that it's raining.

Now what is the sense in which the third-person mindreading system uncontroversially has "access to one's perceptual states"? Clearly the second sense: the mindreading system, like other "consumer systems", has access to perceptually supplied environmental information, for instance that there is a red tomato there. The same goes for belief: the mindreading system has access (at best) to what one believes. Since other consumer systems have access to the very same information, there is nothing here to indicate that the third-person mindreading system supplies self-knowledge of either perception or belief -- to think otherwise would be to conflate the two readings of 'access'.

That was the confused line of thought for implicating the mind-reading system in knowledge of one's perceptual states. As I said, it's not Carruthers's. But as far as I can see the book doesn't contain another argument for this conclusion.


Given that Carruthers endorses the world-to-mind account for perceptual states, one might have expected him to do the same for belief. After all, belief is usually supposed to be the best possible candidate for this sort of treatment. But, as mentioned in the previous section, Carruthers thinks the world-to-mind account fails for belief. Why does he think so?

Carruthers doesn't make the objection that the inference from world to mind is "mad". His objection, rather, takes the form of a dilemma. On the world-to-mind proposal, how do I find out that I believe that whales are mammals? This requires, Carruthers says, "asking [myself] the first-order question, 'Are whales mammals?'" (82). The dilemma arises when we consider what the response might be. On one horn of the dilemma, it is "some kind of verbal or other imagistic performance", for instance an utterance in inner speech of the sentence 'Whales are mammals'. Carruthers argues that this "collapses [the account] into a form of expressivism" (83).

On the second horn,

the query, 'Are whales mammals?' directed at one's semantic memory system issues in a non-imagistic judgment that whales are mammals. But then in order for this act of recognition to provide the input necessary for Byrne's belief-ascribing rule to be applied, there would have to be some informational link to the latter. And this seems tantamount to postulating a form of inner sense. The information that a judgment is occurring with the content, whales are mammals, would have to be accessible to whatever mental faculty is charged with applying the rule, "P, so I believe that P." (82)

A proponent of the world-to-mind account should take the second horn, perhaps while demurring at Carruthers's talk of "judgment", which is something of a philosophical term of art. If a judgment is the onset of the state of belief, then there is no judgment occurring with the content, whales are mammals, since one believes that whales are mammals already. If a judgment is supposed to be something else, then (pending the details) it is unclear that there are such things. In any case, since Carruthers certainly does not think that inner sense is needed for reasoning in general, why does he think it is needed here? Suppose I reason: the kettle is whistling, so the water is boiling. The information that I believe that the kettle is whistling (or, if you like, the information that a judgment is occurring with the content, the kettle is whistling) does not have to be accessible to whatever faculty is in charge of this piece of reasoning. The point is simply that one can reason from a premise without knowing that one believes or judges the premise. In particular, reasoning from the premise that whales are mammals does not require a faculty of inner sense to detect that one believes or judges that whales are mammals. And this holds if we add that one reasons from this premise to the conclusion that one believes that whales are mammals.

This hardly scratches the surface of Carruthers's rich and thought-provoking book. Many other topics are discussed at length: mental architecture, inner sense theories, third-person mindreading, alleged dissociations between self- and other-knowledge, the evidence for widespread confabulation, and much more. As is usual with Carruthers's work, the book is packed with numerous references to the empirical literature -- a welcome corrective to work on self-knowledge which blithely disregards it. The Opacity of Mind contains much to disagree with, but also much to learn.[2]


Boyle, M. 2011. Transparent self-knowledge. Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume 85: 233-41.

Byrne, A. 2005. Introspection. Philosophical Topics 33: 79-104.

Byrne, A. 2011. Knowing what I see. Introspection and Consciousness, ed. D. Smithies and D. Stoljar. New York: Oxford University Press.

Carruthers, P. 2009. How we know our own minds: The relationship between mindreading and metacognition. Behavioral and Brain Sciences 32: 121-82.

Friedman, O., and A. R. Petrashek. 2009. Non-interpretive metacognition for true beliefs. Behavioral and Brain Sciences 32: 146-7.

Gallois, A. 1996. The World Without, the Mind Within: An Essay on First-Person Authority. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Moran, R. 2001. Authority and Estrangement. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.

Ryle, G. 1949. The Concept of Mind. London: Hutchinson.

[1] For Ryle, see 1949: 154. On Carruthers's usage, one has privileged access to mental states of kind M iff "one knows of these mental states in a way that others can't" (14). This usage is unfortunate, because "privileged access" in this sense need not involve any kind of epistemically superior access. Indeed, it may involve epistemically inferior access: the first-person way of knowing might deliver knowledge only infrequently.

[2] A version of this review was presented at an Author-Meets-Critics session at the 2012 Pacific APA.