The Opacity of Narrative

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Peter Lamarque, The Opacity of Narrative, Rowman and Littlefield, 2014, 213pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781783480166.

Reviewed by James Harold, Mount Holyoke College


Peter Lamarque's new book is neither a monograph nor a mere anthology of previously published pieces. It consists of ten chapters, eight of which have been previously published in some form; in some cases, the present version has been substantially revised from the original version. The chapters are thematically related and there is a sense of an overall argument building throughout the book, but there are also discussions that cover the same ground in different chapters, the occasional inconsistency, and some tangential discussions that don't contribute to the main line of argument. These features make the book less coherent than one would hope. Like all of Lamarque's writings, however, it is provocative and thoughtfully argued, and it rewards careful reading.

The central philosophical idea is in the title: opacity. Opacity is a kind of interest in fictional works: it treats the characters and events in works as though they were "constituted by the modes of their presentation in the narrative." (3) The most important part of opacity is that when we read in this way, we understand the content of the work (the fictional world) only in terms of the particular way in which it is described. Transparency is the converse of opacity: it is a way of reading that construes the events and characters as though they were part of a fictional world that we see through a particular work of literature but where the language used to open up the world to us is purely a means to the end: our interest in what is being described. Opacity and transparency are not features of particular works, but ways of reading works: "Transparency and opacity in narrative are not intrinsic qualities of a narrative but ultimately rest on the interests brought to the text." (11-12) If Lamarque's book as a whole has a thesis, it is something like this: that serious interest in works of literature oughtto treat those works as opaque.

Here is one way to understand the difference: reading Michael Chabon's novel The Final Solution, one may be taken with the question of whether the main character (simply called "the old man" in the text) is Sherlock Holmes. To ask this question is to treat the literary work as a mere window onto an already existing world -- Sherlock Holmes' -- and so to read transparently. Consider this passage, in which the old man meets a young boy and his parrot and hears the parrot recite a series of numbers in German.

"Bist du deutscher?" the old man finally managed, a little uncertain, for a moment, of whether he was addressing the boy or the parrot. It had been thirty years since he had last spoken German, and he felt the words tumble from a high back shelf of his mind.

Cautiously, with a first flicker of emotion in his gaze, the boy nodded.

The old man stuck his injured finger into his mouth and sucked it without quite realizing that he did so, without remarking the salt flavor of his own blood. To encounter a solitary German, on the South Downs, in July 1944, and a German boy at that -- here was a puzzle to kindle old appetites and energies.[1]

For the reader (provided she is familiar with the character Sherlock Holmes from the works of Doyle) who approaches this text transparently, attention will instantly be drawn to passages like "It had been thirty years since he had last spoken German" and "here was a puzzle to kindle old appetites and energies." Such a reader will be drawn to the world of Sherlock Holmes and its accompanying mythos, thinking of Holmes' method of ratiocination and wondering whether Holmes spoke German in any of the original Doyle stories.

Lamarque contends that while we can and often do take this kind of interest in works of literature, it is not really literary interest. Literary interest, and the particular value of literature, lies in the particular ways in which the work presents us with the material. When we see a work as opaque, it makes no sense to ask whether the world of Chabon's novel is the same as the world of Lamarque's: "The very identity of the 'world' rests on the mode of presentation in the novel." (181) Works of literature, for Lamarque, ought not to be treated as mere instruments that we use to access (as it were) independently existing fictional worlds. Literary worlds and literary works are instead to be treated as though they were ineliminably bound up with one another. "[W]e insist that no paraphrase of a literary work is substitutable for the original because of the importance we attach to that precise fineness of expression in identifying the work's content." (12)

In setting out his account of opacity vs. transparency, Lamarque draws on Quine's account of referential opacity as well as Scruton on the transparency of photographs. It is strange, however, that he nowhere mentions Richard Wollheim's "twofoldness" thesis, which is quite similar to Lamarque's view. The twofoldness thesis says that we must attend simultaneously to both the medium and the object represented in it.[2] Wollheim's thesis is mainly directed at painting, though he applies it to poetry as well. His aim, like Lamarque's, is to show that proper aesthetic attention demands that we be aware of not just the object depicted but the ways in which it is depicted.

However, though they share certain similarities, twofoldness and opacity are not quite the same. For example, Wollheim places great emphasis on simultaneously divided attention -- our attention is focused in two places at once. Lamarque's characterization of opacity suggests that our attention is not divided but unified: our attention to the medium just is our attention to the content.

At the heart of narrative opacity is the idea that a reader's attention to textual nuances, implicit evaluations, narrator reliability, symbolic resonance, humour, irony, tone, allusions or figurative meanings in the textual content will help give precise shape to the thoughts and beliefs that the content brings to mind. (149)

This comparison with twofoldness allows us to ask two questions about opacity. First, is our attention really unified in this way? Or can reading opaquely divide our attention, as Wollheim thought? Consider again the passage above from Chabon. Many works of literature allude to other works of literature or other extra- and meta-textual matters. Perhaps it is true that we can attend closely to the medium of Chabon's writing at the same time that we consider its content. But might not Wollheim be right that we are in fact dividing our attention between two different aspects of the work: the "fictional world" of Holmes on the one hand and Chabon's somewhat bemused style on the other? Lamarque claims that when we read opaquely, we cannot divorce content from form. But it seems that sometimes we do (or at least I do.)

It is likely that Lamarque would respond by saying that of course we sometimes divide our attention, but when we do so, we give up reading opaquely and read transparently. But this response would not quite do. For when my attention is divided, Wollheim-style, I am not ignoring the medium and its literary features; I am attending to them as well -- my attention is twofold.

The second question we can ask about opacity is whether attention to the fictional world itself can, after all, be aesthetic and reward literary attention. Lamarque's view is that this is only true in the sense provided by opacity: a fictional world, understood as "an elaborate imaginative construct built on a wealth of fine-grained description and infused throughout with symbolic significance." (180) But he does not consider the possibility that fictional worlds treated as imaginative places that are thought of by the reader independent of the particular language that gave rise to them might also have aesthetic value.

Many works of "genre" fiction -- mystery, science fiction, fantasy, romance, etc. -- are typically read "transparently." Despite the fact that opacity and transparency describe not works of fiction but our attention to them, Lamarque seems to think that some works demand to be read opaquely and others do not. Though he does not say so directly, it does not seem too much of a stretch to imagine that Lamarque would consider Doyle's Holmes stories, and most other "genre" writing, to fit in the latter category. (69-72 ff.) But why cannot an interest in the fictional world itself be aesthetic? Lamarque characterizes the aesthetic ideals of literary reading in terms of symmetry, unity, harmony, and the like. (179) But these are terms that might well be used to describe fictional worlds. Here is Chabon describing the value of the worlds created by authors like Tolkien and Doyle:

Readers of Tolkien often recall the strange narrative impulse engendered by those marginal regions named and labeled on the books' endpaper maps, yet never visited or even referred to by the characters in The Lord of the Rings. All enduring popular literature has this open-ended quality, and extends an invitation to the reader to continue, on his or her own, with the adventure. Through a combination of trompe l'oeil allusions [sic] of imaginative persistence of vision, it creates a sense of an infinite horizon of play, an endless game board; it spawns, without trying, a thousand sequels, diagrams, and Web sites.[3]

Chabon is describing an interest that he and many others take in the world of Sherlock Holmes and other fictional worlds. This is an interest that is not fixed or limited by the particular language used in any fictional work. Instead, he claims that attention to the fictional world in this way (which I think Lamarque would call transparent) can be rewarding aesthetically.

Lamarque would have, I think, many objections to this kind of account of aesthetic value in literature, but first and foremost he would claim that even if such experiences did have aesthetic value, it would not be literaryaesthetic value: "If aesthetics is to be at all relevant to literature, it must . . . capture something distinctive about literature as an art form." (172) But perhaps Lamarque's criterion is too demanding -- perhaps what literature offers us is access to aesthetic experiences, and the work of literature is, in fact, a means and not an end in itself.

Lamarque's book is rich and covers many subjects, some closer to the central theme of opacity and some more peripheral. There are chapters on fictional truth and literary knowledge, non-fictional literature and its value, emotional responses to literature, the value of narrative in one's self-conception, and Wittgenstein's notion of a practice. All of these discussions are rich and worth reading. (Lamarque's skepticism about the role of narrative in one's self-conception in Chapter 1 is particularly well-done -- he shows that there is a crucial ambiguity in what we mean by "narrative" and that the kind of narrative we find in literary fiction is not appropriate to the more minimal narrative we might apply to our own lives.) I will not attempt to discuss all of these, but a brief discussion of Chapter 10, "On Keeping Psychology Out of Literary Criticism," may be warranted.

Lamarque's main target in Chapter 10 is Jenefer Robinson's view that the emotional responses of the reader play "a significant role in literary critical judgments of meaning or value." (185) Lamarque's view is that proper literary engagement (that is, opaque engagement) does not require the reader to have particular affective responses in understanding or assessing the work. First, Lamarque doubts that all readers really do have the strong emotional responses that Robinson describes: "Robinson knows enough about emotions to know that they are not always easy to predict and depend on complex sets of circumstances both in the psychology of individuals and in surrounding conditions." (196)

Second, and more important, Lamarque maintains that Robinson's central argument for the essential role of reader emotion in the understanding (and hence the evaluation) of fiction is flawed. Robinson's argument goes like this (I have enumerated the steps):

1.     "Understanding character is essential to understanding the great realist novels . . .

2.     Understanding character is relevantly like understanding real people . . .

3.     Understanding real people is impossible without emotional engagement with them and their predicaments."[4]

4.     Hence, emotional engagement with characters and their predicaments is essential to understanding the great realist novels.

Lamarque takes issue with premise (2). Understanding characters, he argues, is not relevantly similar to understanding real people if we are reading opaquely. "Now we attend to the character as an integral part of a linguistic artefact, in which the fine-grainedness of the presentation informs our response to it. Other elements, literary elements, come into play." (197) Lamarque contends that the reader's emotional response is neither necessary nor even particularly helpful in engaging with these literary details. Lamarque claims that when the reader actually cries, relaxes, shudders, etc., these responses are irrelevant to her coming to an understanding of the fine-grained literary features of the work.

However, Lamarque's critique of Robinson neglects one of the critical elements of Robinson's theory of emotion, which offers her a direct response to his criticism. According to Robinson, emotions are processes whose primary function is to focus our attention back on the environment in such a way as to help us understand and respond to it. Fear, for example, makes us better at noticing potential threats. In Robinson's view, emotion focuses our attention on "things in the environment significant to me or mine," and it "gets my body ready for appropriate action."[5] When we are reading, she maintains, responding emotionally serves to get us to attend to details in the work that we might otherwise neglect or fail to appreciate.

So, for Robinson, emotion is not irrelevant to the job of appreciating the fine-grained literary features of the work -- the kind of opaque reading that Lamarque recommends would, for Robinson, require the emotions for guidance. There is an infinity of details one could attend to in reading; emotions sharpen our attention and make certain elements of the work salient. Without an emotional response to tell us what matters and what does not, we cannot hope to discover which of all of the fine grained literary elements present in the text is important or how to read them. Perhaps Lamarque could offer a response to Robinson here, but I'm not sure what exactly he might say. At any rate, the discussion of Robinson and of emotion more generally in Chapter 10 suffers from neglecting to discuss the claim about the connection between emotion and attention.

Last, though it seems churlish to say so, it is hard not to wish that Lamarque had spent the time to turn this collection into a monograph. Certain inconsistencies arise from the fact that chapters are drawn from articles published at different points in time. For example, the distinction between literary fiction and fiction per se is made in both Chapter 2 and Chapter 4 but the distinction is drawn differently in each chapter. In Chapter 4, we are told that the difference between fiction per se and literary fiction is that the works of fiction per se are "merely transparent vehicles for promoting imaginings." (72) Only in literary fiction is our attention drawn to "connective and thematic functions of character descriptions." (72) But in Chapter 2, we were told that in both literary fiction and fiction per se, we take an interest in connective and thematic aspects of characterization, but only in literary fiction do we take an interest in "universal" thematic concepts. (48) Similarly, narrative is defined in slightly different ways in different chapters -- and each time, the concept is introduced as though it had not been discussed previously. These inconsistencies are not important, but they do lead to some confusion, which could have been avoided with some careful editing.

Despite these minor problems, the book has much to offer. The central idea of opacity both illuminates some of Lamarque's earlier work and builds on it. Lamarque is, arguably, the leading figure in philosophy of literature, and this book will undoubtedly have a major influence on philosophical discussions for many years to come. It is filled with careful and well-laid out literary examples and subtle arguments, and it continually manifests a curious and wide-ranging intelligence.

[1] Chabon, The Final Solution: A Story of Detection (Harper-Collins, 2004), pp. 5-6.

[2] See "Seeing-as, Seeing-in, and Pictorial Representation," Art and Its Objects (2nd ed.), Cambridge University Press, 1980, pp. 205-226.

[3] "Fan Fictions: On Sherlock Holmes," in his Maps and Legends: Reading and Writing along the Borderlands (New York: Harper Perennial, 2008), p. 44. I discuss this quote, and the larger question of the aesthetic value of fictional worlds in my "The Value of Fictional Worlds (or, Why The Lord of the Rings is Worth Reading)," Contemporary Aesthetics 8 (2010). 

[4] Robinson, Deeper than Reason: Emotion and Its Role in Literature, Music, and Art (Oxford University Press, 2005), p. 126. This passage is quoted in Lamarque, p. 197. The final step here is my interpolation.

[5] Robison (2005), p. 59.