The Open Future: Why Future Contingents are All False

Open Future

Patrick Todd, The Open Future: Why Future Contingents are All False, Oxford University Press, 2021, 224pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192897916.

Reviewed by Mitch Green, University of Connecticut


Patrick Todd characterizes future contingents as “propositions saying of contingent, presently undetermined events that they will happen” (3). He describes the task of his book as being a defense of a novel position about how to interpret such propositions (or the sentences that express them). The book comprises eight chapters: Chapter One introduces the problem of how to interpret future contingents and provides metaphysical justification for Todd’s position; Chapter Two elucidates and distinguishes three models of the metaphysics of time and indeterminism; Chapter Three develops semantic concepts and extensively discusses the linguistic phenomenon of neg-raising to explain away some of the intuitions that go against Todd’s own position. Chapter Four discusses the relation of ‘will’ and ‘would’, while Chapter Five discusses omniscience in the context of the open future. Chapter Six responds to an argument due to A.N. Prior that if the future were open in the way that someone like Todd holds it to be, betting on future contingents would not be rational in the way we think it can be. Chapter Seven, previously published elsewhere and co-authored with Brian Rabern, discusses the logic of temporal omniscience, and includes an appendix critiquing what Todd terms ‘retro-closure.’ Finally, Chapter Eight, discusses assertions about the future.

Suppose that our world is objectively indeterministic in that there are points in time at which the laws of physics and state of the universe at that time do not causally determine everything that occurs subsequently. Imagine that a sea battle between two great navies is one such causally possible but not causally necessary event. Then consider:

SB1. There will be a sea battle tomorrow.

SB2. There will not be a sea battle tomorrow.

On a view often termed ‘Ockhamism’, (SB1) may still be true when uttered at a time t one day prior to the time in question. This is because the Ockhamist holds that even in the face of objective indeterminism, there is still always an actual future—a course of events such that these events are what will occur. On what Todd terms the contrasting, Open Future (OF) doctrine, none of the causally possible continuations of an indeterministic moment is actual at t. Todd also entertains the possibility of a third view according to which there is an actual future, but it is indeterminate which future that is (2021 34; 41; 55).[1]

Chapter One proffers a metaphysical argument for the OF view. We begin with a standard tripartition among three ontological theories concerning time: eternalism (all times exist), presentism (only the present exists), and the growing block theory (only past times and the present time exist). Todd argues:

1. If there are true future contingents, the truth of these future contingents would not supervene on present reality.

2. All truth supervenes on present reality. So,

3. There are no true future contingents. (12)

Todd acknowledges that premise 1 will be challenged by those (such as Bigelow 1996) holding that the present might contain properties such as its going to be the case that there is a sea-battle tomorrow. However, Todd argues that such properties could not be discerned by empirical inspection of things as they currently are, and infers that such “Lucretian” properties constitute an “ontological extravagance.” (12–13)

After defending a metaphysical doctrine about the future in the context of indeterminism, Todd proceeds in Chapter Two to provide a semantic account of ‘will’ and its cognates. Indeed, he avers that the thesis of his book is that the disjunction of (SB1) and (SB2) is not an instance of the Law of Excluded Middle.[2]

This semantic account rests on Todd’s notion of an “available future.” The present state of the physical universe, including all laws of nature, might not causally determine every detail of what is to come, such as whether the aforementioned sea battle transpires. As we have seen, the Ockhamist holds that in addition to all that obtains in the current state of the physical universe, there is, now, a fact of the matter as to whether the sea battle will transpire. That is then a future-directed fact singling out a particular one from among those causally possible futures as being available in Todd’s sense. By contrast, an open future (OF) position makes no use of the notion of future-directed facts, and holds that the available futures are precisely those that are causally possible.


With the notion of an available future in place, Todd offers the following truth conditions for future contingents:

(PT) ‘It will be the case in n units of time that P’ is true just in case on all available histories, in n units of time, P. (30)[3]

From this perspective, SB2 is structurally ambiguous in a way that we would expect with sentences combining negation and quantification; thus on at least one reading of SB2, it is not the negation of SB1. Instead, the following is:

SB3. It is not the case that there will be a sea battle tomorrow.

OF conjoined with PT also entails that in the scenario imagined, SB1, is false. More generally, Todd maintains that all future contingents are false and their negations are true. Accordingly, Todd tells us that the core argument of the book is as follows:

1. Semantically, ‘will’ is a quantifier over available futures.

2. Metaphysically, there are no primitive future-directed facts, and so the available branches are just those that are causally possible.

Therefore, 3. Future contingents are all false. (40)

This conclusion stands in contrast with another flavor of OF view on which future contingents are neither true nor false.[4]

Much of Chapter Three is devoted to defending OF+PT against objections. There Todd argues that its preservation of the classical law LEM is a credential in its favor. He also urges that even if ‘SB1 v SB3’ is true, there is still no fact of the matter as to whether a sea battle occurs on the appointed date (82–3). But the bulk of the chapter is devoted to challenging arguments by John MacFarlane (2014) and Fabrizio Cariani and Paolo Santorio (2018) that ‘will’ is semantically scopeless, that is that there is no difference in truth-conditions between SB3 and

SB4. It will be the case that there is no sea battle tomorrow.

Todd argues that the intuition that SB3 and SB4 have identical truth conditions depends on the implicit assumption of an Ockhamist metaphysical picture (56). He also argues at length that ‘will’ is a neg-raising expression like ‘believe’: just as ‘I don’t believe that p’ is naturally read as ‘I believe that not-p,’ so too, ‘It won’t rain,’ is naturally read as ‘It will be the case that it does not rain.’ This phenomenon is what makes us hear SB3 as equivalent to SB4 even though they have different truth conditions.

Todd also argues in Chapter Three against a principle he terms ‘Will Excluded Middle’:

WEM: It will be in n units of time that p, or it will be in n units of time that not-p. (35).

WEM is to be distinguished from the claim that it will be in n units of time that either p or not-p. Once we heed this distinction, it emerges that any plausibility WEM has rests on Ockhamist considerations. Todd then devotes the bulk of Chapter Four to drawing out parallels between the considerations we adduce against WEM and reasons that other authors have invoked to challenge an analogous principle for conditionals, namely,

Conditional Excluded Middle (CEM): If it had been the case that p, then it would have been the case that q, or if it had been the case that p, it would have been the case that not-q. (84)

With the aid of extensive quotations from authors such as Tim Williamson (1988, 2010), Todd points to an analogy: While skeptics of CEM, such as Williamson, charge the defender of CEM with positing counterfactuals whose truth is not grounded in any categorical facts, so too, Todd charges defenders of WEM with positing a metaphysical grounding for future-directed fact that cannot be cashed out in any aspect of current physical reality.

Chapter Five addresses omniscience from the perspective of OF+PT. Here Todd argues that one consideration favoring his position is that it makes possible a simple and otherwise plausible theory of omniscience. In so arguing, Todd makes contact with what has come to be called open theism, according to which if the future is open in the way described by OF, even an omniscient being does not know whether a particular future contingent will come to pass—for instance whether tomorrow’s possible sea battle will take place. For there is, now, nothing there to know. Todd also argues that his approach to omniscience is superior to a rival that he terms Limited Foreknowledge Open Theism, on which even though there is an actual future, God does not have epistemic access to it. This view deprives God of omniscience, whereas OF+PT does not.

Central to Todd’s approach is the idea that p is logically equivalent to God believes that p. Accordingly, on the version of OF+PT that Todd defends, God will not believe any future contingents to be either true or false. This in turn reveals that in spite of being omniscient, God’s not believing that p does not entail that God believes that not-p; or as Todd expresses it, the absence of God’s anticipation of a future event does not entail God’s anticipation of its absence (111). The point carries over to lotteries. Suppose we know that tomorrow’s lottery is guaranteed to have a winning ticket, in spite of the fact that the process of selecting the winner will be indeterministic. Thus for each ticket t, the sentence, ‘The winner of the lottery will be t’, is a future contingent. In spite of this, we may be tempted to say that an omniscient being would know which of the (say) 10 million tickets sold today will be the winner tomorrow. Todd urges us to resist this temptation, and to deny that even an omniscient being would know, now, which ticket will win tomorrow (112–115).

Chapter Six concerns the practice and apparent rationality of bets placed on future contingents. Todd’s point of departure is Prior’s (1976) argument that betting on future contingents would be irrational in an OF framework. Prior’s argument assumes that whether the bettor wins or loses such a bet should be determined by what is the case at the time the bet is placed. Following suggestions by Charles Hartshorne (1965) and Nuel Belnap and Mitchell Green (2001), Todd’s response is to argue instead that a properly structured bet will specify wins and losses depending on how things come to pass rather than what is the case at the time the bet is made. Thus, if I bet $5 that the coin will land heads, then I am owed $5 on all courses of future events on which it lands heads, and owe $5 on all the rest. Accordingly, betting on future events is not to be construed as a bet on what is the case now, but instead as an arrangement as to how wins and losses are to be distributed depending on what comes to pass.

Todd considers the objection that, on the OF approach, the probability of ‘The coin lands heads tomorrow’ is zero because that sentence is false. This might seem to make betting on the coin toss irrational. However, Todd suggests that the rationality of the bet should be determined not by that probability but rather by the probability of the coin coming up heads, which is .5 if the coin is fair, together with the amount wagered. He puts the point more generally by remarking,

What matters to the rationality of [a] bet [. . .] is not the likelihood of any given future contingent; what matters is instead the strength of the world’s current tendencies. (132)

Todd, then, must hold that in the case of the above coin, the probability that it comes up heads is .5, while the probability of ‘The coin will land heads’ is zero. Todd extends his approach to the case of probability statements about works of fiction. Here, while in many cases questions concerning what is true in a fiction have no determinate answers (there is no fact of the matter of how many threads were in the bonnet worn by Jane Eyre in a particular scene in the novel of that name), nevertheless some answers are more likely than others (10,000 threads is more likely then 100, for instance).

Chapter Seven, co-authored with Brian Rabern, and published previously as Todd and Rabern (2021), returns to issues of divine omniscience in the context of the OF view. The thrust of the chapter is to challenge an intuitively appealing principle that is the theological image of retro-closure, more precisely, that if God believes that p, then God remembers anticipating that p. I will focus on an appendix added by Todd in which he focuses on a non-theistic analogue, namely

Retro-Closure: If p, then it was the case in the past that it would be the case that p.

For instance, Thomason voices a widely shared intuition when he writes,

Arguments such as ‘there is space travel; therefore it was the case that space travel would come about’ strike us as valid on logical grounds. (1970, 268)

The bulk of authors who have considered Retro-Closure have, like Thomason, endorsed it as a logical truth. Yet, as Todd notes, authors who endorse this principle tend to do so on grounds concerning what we would say of someone whose prediction is borne out: if on Monday Riva predicts that it will snow on Tuesday, and Tuesday sees snow; then we are tempted to say, on Tuesday, that Riva’s utterance on Monday was correct. Drawing on remarks of Richard Taylor (1957), Todd notes that this way of speaking is not mandatory; we could as accurately describe the situation as one in which Riva’s prediction came true. (Although less idiomatic, we should also be able to say that some predictions come false.) This notion of a prediction coming true or false is one that a defender of the OF view can consistently endorse, and Todd, invoking Belnap and Green (2001), does so in terms of the idea of a prediction being vindicated or impugned.

In Chapter Eight, The Assertion Problem, Todd addresses a family of concerns about the practice of making predictions that might seem to beset an OF view. At the root of the concern is the thought that if there is, now, no fact as to whether there is to be a sea battle tomorrow, then predicting that battle would seem to be irrational. That concern is especially acute for the semantic approach that Todd champions, since any such prediction is false at the time it is made. In response, Todd offers what he calls a “replacement strategy” for many such predictions. The thought is that we could if we chose replace our talk of what will happen with talk of present tendencies (such as when we say it will rain tomorrow on the strength of today’s forecast of 90% chance of rain for then); or with reference to present plans or commitments (such as when I tell you I will be at your party on Friday), or with reference to what is currently scheduled (“The wedding begins at 4 pm”). Predictions not falling into one of these three categories are, by Todd’s lights, irrational (196).

Todd’s defense of OF+PT is novel and resourceful, showing that a view of this kind merits serious consideration both from those concerned with the metaphysics of time and those interested in the semantics and pragmatics of our discourse about it. One qualm we may have with the approach defended in the book is that it leaves unclear how crucial ‘will’ and cognate constructions are to the phenomenon of future contingency. For it would seem that we can formulate future contingents without such language. On January 1, 2050, Amelia is asked, “What do you predict happens on the Black Sea between opposing navies?” Amelia replies:

SB5. Turkey and Russia wage a sea battle on January 2, 2050.

If a Russia/Turkey confrontation on the day in question is causally possible but not causally necessitated, then SB5 has as good a claim to being considered a future contingent as does SB1. SB5 also has perfectly clear truth conditions, containing no quantification or other potential sources of structural ambiguity. What truth-value would Todd assign to it? Given his metaphysical scruples about Ockhamism, it would be most natural for him to say it is false when uttered on January 1, 2050, and becomes true if the battle transpires on January 2; it will stay false if the battle does not transpire. But Todd will then need to hold that SB5’s negation,

SB6. It is not the case that Turkey and Russia wage a sea battle on January 2, 2050,

is true when uttered on January 1. That seems a presumptuous thing to say for an ardent defender of the open future doctrine, particularly if there is strong evidence of an impending Turkish/Russian confrontation. What is more, if the battle does occur, then Todd will need to agree that SB6 is true until just prior to the time of engagement, and then becomes false. At this point it may seem reasonable to explore flavors of OF on which future contingents are neither true nor false when uttered, but become true (false) depending how history unfolds.[5]


Belnap, N., and M. Green (2001) ‘Indeterminism and the Thin Red Line,’ in Facing the Future (Oxford, 2001): 133–176.

Bigelow, J. (1996) ‘Presentism and Properties,’ in J. Tomberlin (ed.) Philosophical Perspectives vol. 10: Metaphysics (Blackwell): 35–52.

Cariani, F., and P. Santorio (2018) ‘Will Done Better: Selection Semantics, Future Credence, and Indeterminacy,’ Mind 127: 129–65.

Green, M. (forth.) ‘Varieties of Future-Contingency,’ Analytic Philosophy.

---(2022) ‘Future Contingents in a Branching Universe,’ in Santelli, Ed. (2022): 73–92.

Hartshorne, C. (1965) ‘The Meaning of “Is Going to Be”,’ Mind 74: 46–58.

MacFarlane, J. (2014) Assessment-Sensitivity: Relative Truth and its Applications (Oxford).

Prior, A. (1976) ‘It Was to Be’ repr. in J.M. Fischer and P. Todd (eds.) Freedom, Fatalism, and Foreknowledge (Oxford): 317–26.

Santelli, A. (Ed.) (2022) Ockhamism and the Philosophy of Time: Semantic and Metaphysical Views Concerning Future Contingents (Springer).

Thomason, R. (1970) ‘Indeterminist Time and Truth-Value Gaps,’ Theoria, 36: 264–81.

Todd, P., and B. Rabern (2021) ‘Future Contingents and the Logic of Temporal Omniscience,’ Nous, vol. 55:102–27.

Williamson, T. (1988) ‘Bivalence and Subjunctive Conditionals,’ Synthese 75: 405–21.

---, and P. Antonsen (2010) ‘Modality and Other Matters: An Interview with Timothy Williamson,’ Perspectives: International Postgraduate Journal of Philosophy, 3: 16–29.

[1] See the papers in Santelli (Ed.) (2022) for an in-depth discussion of Ockhamism. Belnap and Green (2001) refer to future-directed facts posited by Ockhamism as ‘Thin Red Lines.’ Todd (2021, 27–9) criticizes Belnap and Green for thereby conflating two distinct views, namely one on which there is a unique actual future, and it is determinate which future that is; and another on which there is a unique actual future, but it is indeterminate which future that is. So long as we are using ‘determinate’ and its antonym in resolutely ontological rather than epistemic senses, I do not see the coherence of the latter view, and thus do not see the merit of Todd’s criticism.

[2] (2021, 1). I take the Law of Excluded Middle (LEM) to state that for every well-formed sentence S of every natural or formal language, once any ambiguity has been resolved and indexicality is saturated, either S or S’s negation is true.

[3] Todd is aware that his position appears similar to that of Peirce, at least as interpreted by Prior. For on what Todd calls the Peircian view, ‘will’ means roughly, ‘causally determined.’ By contrast, being expressed in terms of the notion of an available future, Todd’s own position provides a semantics for ‘will’ that is sensitive to one’s metaphysical views. Thus on Todd’s position, PT together with Ockhamism will imply that SB1 is true if the actual future is one on which the sea battle occurs. By contrast, the Peircian position will deem SB1 false so long as it is a future contingent.

[4] Such a view is defended in Green 2022.

[5] I develop this criticism at greater length, as well as raise others, in Green (forth.).