The Opinion of Mankind: Sociability and the Theory of the State from Hobbes to Smith

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Paul Sagar, The Opinion of Mankind: Sociability and the Theory of the State from Hobbes to Smith, Princeton University Press, 2018, 248pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691178882.

Reviewed by Christel Fricke, University of Oslo


The book covers a period in the history of political theory that has for a long time attracted a great deal of scholarly attention. It is thus not surprising that much of what the author has to say on the political theories of Hobbes, Locke, Mandeville, Rousseau, Hume, Smith, and Kant and some comparatively minor thinkers sounds familiar to the reader who has read this material. However, the author advances a new claim: He argues that Hume's political thought represents a substantial shift from a Hobbesian understanding of government as sovereignty (shared by Locke, Mandeville, Rousseau, and Kant) to an account of government without sovereignty. While Adam Smith followed Hume, the Hobbesian understanding of government has been dominating political theory until the present day.

Paul Sagar further argues that the political theories of both Hume and Smith imply a new understanding of the very task of political theory. He rejects Rawls's reading of Hume as an 'observing naturalist', claiming that, in order to properly understand Hume's original contribution to political philosophy, 'our understanding of what political philosophy is and can hope to achieve' must itself undergo a major shift (3). To provide some background for this claim, in the Introduction Sagar offers a brief overview of the scholarly explorations of the historical debate, initiated by Hobbes, about the nature of government and the origin and justification of its claims of obedience on its subjects. This overview focuses on work of a narrowly selected group of scholars, including Quentin Skinner, John Dunn, Richard Tuck, Istvan Hont, John Rawls, Raymond Geuss, and Jeremy Walton. What their views have in common is, Sagar argues, that they consider Hobbes and the Hobbesian tradition of political thought as the main source of influence on our actual understanding of the state and its institutions, leaving the alternative provided by Hume and Smith to the side. Sagar's claim is that we should pay more attention to this alternative. His interest in the political thought of Hume and Smith is thus not merely historical.

The book has 6 chapters. The first, on 'sociability', takes its starting point from Hobbes' view of humans as naturally selfish, the social dynamics which unfold among selfish individuals and the emerging reasons that motivate people to join the state and submit to the undivided and absolute power of the state's sovereign. By delegating most of their decision-making power to the sovereign, subjects mean to put an end to internal conflicts; furthermore, under the sovereign they can join forces to resist aggression from other states. Sagar claims that both Hume and Smith rejected Hobbes' account of human nature as exclusively selfish, fearful, and conflictual; that they presented humans as sociable and cooperative, and thereby provided the foundation for an alternative view of the dynamics of social life and the reasons that humans had for institutionalizing justice and governments. On the basis of their account of human nature Hume and Smith developed, according to Sagar, a 'vision of the modern state without the theory of sovereignty' (38). Sagar grants that Hume was not the first to describe human nature as sociable, mentioning in particular Shaftesbury as one of Hume's predecessors and sources of inspiration (but, of course, the origin of this thought can be traced much further back in history). And then he recounts Mandeville's critical response to Shaftesbury. Hume critically responded more directly to Mandeville than to Hobbes when he developed his account of human nature as sociable. The chapter ends with a first presentation of Hume's account of the dynamics of human interaction and the emergence of the reasons for joining a state. Given the assumption of human sociability, the transition from pre-political to political life as Hume describes it is much smoother than either Hobbes or Mandeville had claimed.  Principles of justice emerged as artificial virtues before states were established; establishing a state and legislating its laws was a matter of institutionalizing what had already emerged as a social practice and was generally considered desirable.

Chaper 2 looks at the same debate, but this time with a particular focus on 'history' and 'the family'. Narratives about what kinds of people humans naturally are, about how their interaction unfolds and which conflicts arise among them, and about which reasons they have for establishing a state and its political institutions vary. They are meant to be historically more or less realistic, they can be the object of thought experiments, and they provide different accounts of the way in which family structures provided a model for the structure of a state. Sagar claims that what Hume rejected in Hobbes was not his theory of the social contract; after all, Hobbes did not mean this theory to provide an explanation about the historical origin of states. He rejected first and foremost Hobbes' view of human nature as unsociable. In Hume's historical account of the origin and institutionalization of justice family structures play an eminent role: From the very beginning of human existence, humans lived in families; families are cooperative social groups; the virtue of justice first emerges in families and small social groups; families provide a model structure for a political state. Hume recounts the progress from small scale to large scale societies which led to the foundation of states as driven by concerns of utility for individuals and their families.

Chaper 3 develops one of the main claims Sagar makes, namely, that Hume defends the idea of a 'state without sovereignty'. He denies that Hume has a theory of sovereignty, that his focus is not on the ruler, but on those ruled. What Sagar means is that, according to Hume, humans had developed principles of cooperation as well as a motivational disposition to submit to these principles and to the authority of the head of a family long before they institutionalized states. Accordingly, their motivation to follow the laws of the state was not a matter of letting themselves be governed by a superior, by a sovereign, but it was a habitualized disposition to pro-social behaviour as it had emerged from experiences of cooperation and their socialization within the confines of families. What John Dunn and others named Hume's 'political sociology' was not only meant to provide a historically realistic explanation of how states came into being.

According to Sagar, what Hume's historical and sociological explanation implies is a denial of the need of a political theory of a state and the authority of the sovereign. The doctrine of sovereignty is a doctrine that justifies the authority of a state, the right of the sovereign to exercise coercive power over his subjects and the subject's obligation to submit to his authority. But if rules of pro-social behaviour emerge independently of a state, if the motivation of people to submit to these rules can exist independently of the authority of a sovereign, and if the laws of a state are mostly overlapping with the rules of pro-social behaviour of the respective society, then citizenship does not need to imply submission to the coercive power of a sovereign, and thus the state can exist without a sovereign. This is the view Sagar attributes to Hume. Sagar understands Hume's project as 'attempting a fundamental recasting of how to think about both the status of philosophy as an enterprise with practical political import, and what we can coherently hope and expect from any notion of political obligation appropriate to a secular world' (106). In what remains of this chapter Sagar explains why Hume rejected the Lockean account of sovereignty even though Locke already held the view that social rules can emerge independently of the authority of the state. According to Locke, conflicts in pre-political societies emerged from individuals' practices of defending what they considered their own and of punishing aggressors. They could only solve this problem by constituting a state and delegating all coercive power, including in particular the power to punish those who violated the law, to the sovereign. At this point in the argument, the reader would expect an account of Hume's understanding of the state's power to punish law-violation. But Sagar does not raise this issue. Instead, he goes back to his main claim according to which the state as Hume understands it is a state without sovereignty. According to Sagar, Hume denies both the need and the possibility of providing a normative justification of government authority outside a historically grown practice of citizenship and a shared opinion that certain state institutions possess authority and deserve obedience: 'Rather than avoiding the crucial normative issues surrounding political obligation, he presented these as coherently intelligible only from within the internal perspective generated by human political practice' (135). As if one could not raise questions of justification about actual social practices without denying that they emerged from contingent historical processes.

Chapter 4 is dedicated to Rousseau and Rousseau's return to Hobbes' understanding of state sovereignty. Here, Sagar provides a detailed and insightful account of Rousseau's view of human nature and of the dynamics of humans' life in society and the conflicts to which it gives rise. He compares Rousseau's views not only to those of Hobbes, but also to Hume's and Mandeville's.

Chapter 5 develops a claim made earlier in the book, namely that Adam Smith followed Hume and developed a 'political theory of opinion'. While Sagar sees a great deal of continuity between Hume's and Smith's views on political matters, he does not deny important points of disagreement. Among the latter, Sagar mentions the emergence of justice and its institutionalization, the restriction of justice to the regulation of the institution of property, and the relationship between justice, utility, and sociability. According to Smith, the origin of justice is to be found in humans' natural propensity to resent selfish behaviour, not in their recognition of the utility of cooperation. As to the controversy among Smith scholars about whether Smith's account of justice and its origin allowed him to explain and justify certain principles as necessary parts of all laws of nations, Sagar's claim is that it is 'displaced' (183). Indeed, if Smith did not mean to provide such an explanation, this question does not arise. But Sagar avoids raising the question how Smith's views on the moral origins of justice and the state and his narrative of the historical origin of different political systems under different socio-economic conditions are related.

The concluding chapter explores 'alternatives and applications' of the view of the state Sagar attributes to Hume and Smith. Here, he moves to Kant and his views on political authority, comparing Kant's views to those of Hobbes and to those of Smith. He expresses his preference for the Humean and Smithian view of the state and its authority and suggests that actual political theory should not continue to focus on the tradition of political thought that goes back to Hobbes and was defended also by Kant.

The book covers a fairly long period of political thought. Sagar's references to the scholarly literature on each of the major figures whose views he presents are very selective. He does not make room for any of the controversies about how exactly to understand the political theories developed by Hobbes and those who responded to him. Expert readers will not only miss explicit references to these controversies; they will also miss explicit reference to previous work on this period of the history of political thought and the topics of controversy that shaped it, such as the seminal one provided by Jerome B. Schneewind (The Invention of Autonomy, 1998, CUP).

But the main concern is how Sagar describes the view he attributes to Hume and Smith, namely the view that there is a way to understand a state and its institutions without reference to sovereignty. Given the rather radical nature of this claim, Sagar has surprisingly little to say about the notion of 'sovereignty'. How can a state hold the exclusive right of legislation, jurisdiction, and execution without making any claims to sovereignty? Neither Hume nor Smith denied that exercising these functions was the central task of a state, and, at least with respect to Smith, Sagar is explicit about this. Does not state sovereignty consist in exercising these functions -- in addition to those of controlling its borders and natural resources? But while Sagar's choice of how to conceptualize Hume's and Smith's departure from the Hobbesian tradition of political thought may be somewhat unfortunate, he may still have a point. From the point of view of the citizens of a state, there is a substantial difference between perceiving the state as requesting submission to laws the following of which does not accord with their desires and inclinations, and perceiving the state as prescribing behaviour that is to a large extent in accord with what the citizens desire anyway. In the former case, citizens experience state power as much more coercive than in the latter. Only in the former case do they have constant reason to ask whether the social order the state allows to keep up is worth the effort of obeying its laws. Where the laws of the state institutionalize and thereby stabilize a social order and the normative principles underlying it that had emerged independently of state interference, citizens may not have many good reasons to question its authority. Maybe this is the main message Sager wants to send. This message is important to listen to, given the actual challenges Western democracies are facing. When populations lose homogeneity and implicit social consensus, state authority is both more important and more difficult to uphold.