The Origin and Evolution of Cultures

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Robert Boyd and Peter J.Richerson, The Origin and Evolution of Cultures, Oxford University Press, 2005, 464pp, $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 019518145X

Reviewed by Edouard Machery, University of Pittsburgh


This book is a must-have for philosophers of psychology, philosophers of biology, philosophers of the social sciences, and, more generally, anybody who is interested in the evolution of mind and behavior. The anthropologists Robert Boyd and Peter Richerson have collected twenty of their most important articles written between 1987 and 2003. This collection is an excellent initiative, since these articles were scattered in sometimes hard-to-find journals or books across a large number of disciplines. These articles extend the ground-breaking theory of culture developed in their 1985 book, Culture and the Evolutionary Process. Interested readers should also consult their more popular 2004 book, Not by Genes Alone: How Culture Transformed Human Evolution.

An original and compelling picture of the evolution of our species emerges from the book. Culture is at the heart of this picture. Boyd and Richerson characterize culture in ideational terms: For the most part, culture consists in the beliefs, values, norms, desires, techniques, and so on, that people acquire by social learning. Cultural transmission is not always faithful: Cultural items may be modified, for instance because of transmission inaccuracies or individual innovation. Moreover, not all cultural variants are equal: Boyd and Richerson emphasize various biases that favor the transmission of some cultural variants over others, particularly conformism, compliance to social norms, and imitation of prestigious individuals. Culture is thus a system of inheritance with modification, in which various forces (conformism, etc.) determine which cultural items are preferentially transmitted in a population. In other words, culture evolves.

The general outline should be familiar enough, given the (already fading) popular success of memetics. But, despite a family resemblance, Boyd and Richerson's framework has little to do with memetics. First, and most important, memetics has usually very little explanatory power. Too often, memetic explanations boil down to the uninformative claim that a given meme has spread in a population because it has reproduced itself successfully. The essential issue, What makes it the case that a cultural variant is preferentially transmitted?, is often dodged, or, when it is not, is addressed with sheer speculation. On the contrary, Boyd and Richerson ground their views in the contemporary psychology (but see some reservations below). Mathematical models that describe the spread of cultural items in a population are based on specific hypotheses about people's minds, primarily, the nature of human social learning. To capture the population-level properties of cultural evolution, Boyd and Richerson have adapted the mathematical models of population genetics. They have developed an exciting toolkit of mathematical models that describe various aspects of cultural evolution.

Second, Boyd and Richerson's theory of culture is the cornerstone of their view of the evolution of the human species. According to them, culture is an adaptation, like other forms of social learning in non-human animal species: It enables humans to acquire adaptive behavior in variable environments. But while the scope of social learning is rather restricted in other species, culture pervades human behavior as well as the human mind (Nisbett et al. 2001). Culture differs also from non-human social learning in that it is cumulative: Only humans acquire socially some beliefs, values, and so on, that they could not acquire by themselves.

Moreover, Boyd and Richerson make a decisive case that the evolution of the most distinctive aspects of our species cannot be explained if one neglects culture. Culture sent our species on a unique evolutionary path. To put it differently, culture created some social environments, in which specific adaptations were selected for by natural selection. This notion of gene-culture co-evolution may be the most important aspect of their work. It distinguishes markedly their work from other evolutionary approaches. Boyd and Richerson's models suggest that gene-culture co-evolution could explain, for instance, our propensity to collaborate in large groups of unrelated individuals, which singles out humans in the natural world, as well as our propensity to create social groups that are symbolically marked.

Fascinating as it is, this general picture of culture and of the evolution of our species should not obscure the independent interest of the articles collected in this book. These articles are divided into five sections, introduced by short, but useful forewords. The first section, entitled "The evolution of social learning," focuses on the evolution of cultural transmission. The articles in this section examine the adaptive nature of social learning and investigate why cumulative cultural transmission evolved only in the human species. The second section, entitled "Ethnic groups and markers," describes two models of the cultural evolution of ethnically marked groups. The third section, "Human cooperation, reciprocity, and group selection," focuses on the evolution of cooperation in large groups. It contains some of the best-known and most original contributions of Boyd and Richerson. They show that it is unlikely that reciprocity explains human large-scale cooperation. Cultural transmission may be the key to the puzzle. Cooperative behavior could have evolved culturally due to conformism, together with punishment and cultural group selection. Section 4, "Archaeology and culture history," brings Boyd and Richerson's theory to bear on historical and archaeological issues. The last section, "Links to other disciplines," collects some methodological articles. A few articles may be hard to follow for those readers who are not as savvy in population genetics as our two authors. However, in most articles, the mathematical parts are in appendices. More important, Boyd and Richerson do a very good job of explaining the rationale and main aspects of their mathematical models.

There is much of interest for philosophers. For the sake of space, I pick here a handful of topics. Philosophers interested in the methodology of the social sciences will pay particular attention to Boyd and Richerson's methodological views. Noticeably, our two authors reject many standard dichotomies in the social sciences.

Methodological individualism versus methodological holism. Boyd and Richerson argue that population-level models bridge the gap between these two views: Models of cultural evolution explore the long-term, population-level consequences of hypotheses about people's psychology.

Biological versus cultural explanations of social phenomena. This dichotomy is inconsistent with the gene-culture co-evolution approach.

Functionalism. Social scientists as well as philosophers have regularly questioned the methodological status of functionalist interpretations of social or cultural entities (taboos, norms, etc.). Boyd and Richerson provide an interesting perspective on this issue. On the basis of theoretical models and empirical evidence, they argue that group selection on culturally stabilized group differences is an important force in cultural evolution. They claim that some social properties -- viz. those whose cultural evolution takes centuries -- can be explained functionally.

Many topics will hold the attention of philosophers of biology, for instance:

Human nature. Since at least the sociobiology controversy, philosophers of biology have discussed, usually critically, the value of this notion. Boyd and Richerson show that arguments that pit culture against the notion of human nature are unsound.

Models in evolutionary theory. Although Boyd and Richerson have developed many mathematical models, they endorse a deflationary view of the role of models in evolutionary biology. Models are essentially used to derive rigorously the consequences of hypotheses. This should also interest philosophers of science in general, given the recent work on the notion of model (e.g., Downes 1992).

Finally, philosophers of psychology will be interested in how psychology can be brought in contact with evolutionary theory and anthropology. Indeed, as I have argued elsewhere (Machery and Faucher, forthcoming), Boyd and Richerson's framework may be the key to solve the integration challenge -- i.e., how to integrate the divergent and, in some respects, inconsistent approaches to human behavior in the contemporary social sciences --particularly, an evolutionary-minded psychology and a culturally-oriented anthropology.

It should be clear from the review so far that I truly admire Boyd and Richerson's work. It is the most sophisticated attempt to bring the study of human behavior and psychology within an evolutionary framework. They have not underplayed the particularities of the human species. Instead of bringing human behavior and psychology into the procrustean bed of sociobiological models of social behavior, they have developed sui generis models of gene-culture co-evolution. Moreover, this approach could be the overarching framework for integrating the increasingly scattered social sciences -- primarily, sociology, anthropology, cultural, cognitive and social psychology.

However, a review would not be a review without at least some qualms. Boyd and Richerson refer regularly to experimental psychology in order to justify the hypotheses built into their models. This is certainly laudable. The philosopher of psychology may however feel that our two authors are to some extent out of touch with the most successful works in recent cognitive and developmental psychology (Carey, Spelke, Haidt, to cite a few psychologists). Moreover, their models lean heavily on the study of social learning made in the seventies. The psychological study of social learning should be certainly pushed forward. To be fair, social psychologists themselves have often neglected social learning in the eighties and nineties. Noticeably, some psychologists and experimentally-minded anthropologists, including Richerson and colleagues, have recently brought the experimental method to bear on the study of cultural transmission (Kameda & Nakanishi 2002; Baum et al. 2004).

Second, most of the articles collected in this book are theoretical: They provide models to explain a limited number of puzzling phenomena. Certainly, Boyd and Richerson's framework would be considerably strengthened if it were more strongly connected to empirical research. In fact, several of the collected articles make rather specific empirical predictions. For instance, chapters 6 and 7 on the evolution of ethnic markers predict that the emphasis on ethnic markers should be stronger at the border between two cultural groups. The first two misgivings are related. Boyd and Richerson's framework can be the umbrella for a wealth of interdisciplinary empirical projects, particularly, but not exclusively, in psychology and anthropology. Their research ought to be extended in more empirical directions.

Boyd and Richerson's theory of cultural evolution is a key element in explaining various puzzling features of human nature, for instance large-scale cooperation. However, it is less clear how it could be used by anthropologists and cultural psychologists interested in understanding specific cultural phenomena in specific cultures -- for instance, why a holistic cognitive style is prevalent in Eastern cultures (Nisbett et al. 2001). It would certainly be a shortcoming for Boyd and Richerson's theory of culture if it were mostly useless for such a purpose. Recent work suggests however that their theory can shed a lot of light on specific historical phenomena (e.g., Henrich 2004; McElreath 2004 -- see also Chapter 15, where Boyd and Richerson discuss a related issue).

I conclude with three questions to Boyd and Richerson's theory of culture.

Cultural transmission is affected by various biases. Boyd and Richerson emphasize particularly conformism, norm obedience, and the imitation of prestigious individuals, which are known as "context biases." Others like Sperber (1996) have emphasized the importance of our cognitive systems (called "attractors") in cultural evolution: Some cultural variants spread because they fit our cognitive systems. For instance, meat taboos spread because meat is an evolved trigger of our disgust reaction (Fessler and Navarrete 2003). Although Boyd and Richerson do not deny the importance of attractors, they pay little attention to them. The relative importance of both types of biases in different domains is an important empirical issue (see Henrich and Boyd 2002).

Boyd and Richerson's theory of cultural transmission is strikingly domain-general. It seems tailored to account for the spread of technologies and, maybe, of social norms. However, it is unclear whether it does a good job in all domains. For instance, it is unclear whether it can account for the cultural evolution of our folk mathematical knowledge. Cultural transmission could take different forms in different domains. More empirical work is needed to decide this issue (for some suggestions, see McElreath 2004).

The evolutionary consequences of culture distinguish culture from other kinds of phenotypic plasticity (individual learning etc.). Although Boyd and Richerson don't say that much, they seem to believe that culture is the only type of plasticity that shapes the course of evolution. On the contrary, proponents of evo-devo argue that this is the case of all forms of plasticity. If evo-devo is correct, gene-culture co-evolution could be a particular case of a more general phenomenon.

To conclude briefly, philosophers interested in anthropology, psychology, evolutionary theory, to name a few disciplines, will be amply rewarded for reading this dense collection of articles. Together with their two other books (1985, 2004), this collection is an important landmark in the social sciences.


I would like to thank Frédéric Bouchard, Luc Faucher and Richard McElreath for their comments on a draft of this review.


Boyd, R., and Richerson, P. J. 1985. Culture and the Evolutionary Process. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Downes, S. 1992. The importance of models in theorizing: A deflationary semantic

view. In D. Hull, M. Forbes and K. Okruhlik (Eds.), PSA 1992, Vol. 1. East

Lansing: Philosophy of Science Association.

Fessler, D. M. T., and Navarrete, C. D. 2003. Meat is good to taboo: Dietary proscriptions as a product of the interaction of psychological mechanisms and processes. Journal of Cognition and Culture, 3(1), 1-40.

Henrich, J. 2004. Demography and cultural evolution: Why adaptive cultural processes produced maladaptive losses in Tasmania. American Antiquity, 69(2), 197-211.

Henrich, J., and Boyd, R. 2002. On modeling cognition and culture: Why replicators are not necessary for cultural evolution. Journal of Cognition and Culture, 2(2), 87-112.

Kameda, T., and Nakanishi, D. 2002. Cost-benefit analysis of social/cultural learning in a non-stationary uncertain environment: An evolutionary simulation and an experiment with human subjects. Evolution and Human Behavior, 23, 373-393.

Machery, E., and Faucher, L. Forthcoming. Social construction and the concept of race. Philosophy of Science.

McElreath, R. 2004. Social learning and the maintenance of cultural variation: An evolutionary model and data from East Africa. American Anthropologist, 106(2),308-321.

Nisbett, R. E., Peng, K., Choi, I., and Norenzayan, A. 2001. Culture and systems of thought: Holistic vs. analytic cognition. Psychological Review, 108, 291-310.

Baum, W. M., Richerson, P. J., Efferson, C. M., and Paciotti, B. M. 2004. Cultural evolution in laboratory microsocieties including tradition of rule giving and rule following. Evolution and Human behavior, 25, 305-326.

Richerson, P. J., and Boyd, R. 2004. Not By Genes Alone: How Culture Transformed Human Evolution. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Sperber, D. 1996. Explaining Culture: A Naturalistic Approach. Oxford: Blackwell.