The Origin of the Logic of Symbolic Mathematics: Edmund Husserl and Jacob Klein

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Burt C. Hopkins, The Origin of the Logic of Symbolic Mathematics: Edmund Husserl and Jacob Klein, Indiana University Press, 2011, 559pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780253356710.

Reviewed by Joseph K. Cosgrove, Providence College


This much needed book should go a long way both toward correcting the under-appreciation of Jacob Klein's brilliant work on the nature and historical origin of modern symbolic mathematics, and toward eliciting due attention to the significance of that work for our interpretation of the modern scientific view of the world. One would be hard-pressed to find a more able interpreter of Klein than Burt Hopkins, already our leading scholar on Klein and his relationship to Husserl and phenomenology. Hopkins' treatment carefully explicates the central thesis of Klein's Greek Mathematical Thought and the Origin of Algebra: that modern mathematics is based upon a symbolic reinterpretation of the received Greek understanding of number (arithmos). His discussion has the added virtue of placing Klein's achievement in the context of the philosophical task set forth in Husserl's later phenomenology: the "desedimentation," as it were, of the sense-history of symbolic mathematics (and of modern mathematical science as such insofar as the latter is determined by a symbolic-mathematical representation of the world.)

While Klein's achievement stands on its own, apart from any relationship to Husserlian phenomenology, Klein himself affirmed the interpretive significance for his own work of the historical-phenomenological task set forth by Husserl in later writings such as The Origin of Geometry and Crisis of the European Sciences. Indeed, on Hopkins' view, Klein successfully carried out the phenomenological task defined by, but not satisfactorily completed by, Husserl himself. I believe this is true in part, and it is something on which I elaborate below.

The point of departure for Hopkins' study, and the direct focus of the first of its four main parts, is Klein's account, in "Phenomenology and the History of Science," of the problem of history in Husserl's later writings. Specifically at issue is Husserl's expressed concern over the loss of an "original intuition" to ground symbolic mathematical science, and the consequent breakdown of meaning in that science. For the Husserl of Crisis, the history of this breakdown consists of two stages. First is the geometrical idealization of the world via what he terms "Galilean science" (taken as a kind of collective noun). Second is the formalization of that science by means of symbolic algebra, which latter surreptitiously substitutes symbolic mathematical abstractions for the directly intuited realities of the real world ("life-world"). In the face of such loss of meaning, which fundamentally determines (and threatens) modern western civilization in the modern scientific age, the urgent task of philosophy is to bring to light or to "desediment" (so Hopkins) the historically accreted, and by now almost entirely occluded, original meaning constituents of the concepts of modern mathematical science, so as to recover and reactivate the authentic sense of these concepts.

As an example of Husserl's concern, we might consider the concept "force" used in contemporary physics textbooks. Typically, force is defined in such texts in an experientially direct or intuitive manner, as a "push or a pull." That conception of force soon gives way, however, to the algebraic formula F=ma, in which F ("force") is understood as the algebraic product of (mass) and a(acceleration). I challenge the reader to attach a coherent physical sense to "multiplying" a number of, say, kilograms, by a number of "meters per second-squared." After all, how do I take seven kilograms five meters per second-squared times? Instead, what we really do is multiply two symbolic dimensionless numbers together (7 x 5) and then "plug" the result into the units of force.

Husserl's aim is not to debar science from progressing beyond concepts of direct experience, but rather to demand that symbolic meaning formations laying claim to physical intelligibility account for themselves in terms of an intelligible sense-genesis in intuition or direct experience. The symbolic formations of modern mathematical physics, however (of which F=ma is one of the more elementary examples), lack such an intuitively evident sense-genesis. The result is that empirical meaning finds itself replaced by mere empirical correlation, as experimental predictions are derived from mathematical formulas themselves devoid of intelligibility.

Hopkins notes that while Klein endorses both Husserl's analysis of the breakdown of meaning, and the latter's historical-phenomenological method of desedimenting the modern mathematization of nature, he departs from the content of Husserl's analysis. Klein characterizes Husserl's attempt (sketched principally in "The Origin of Geometry" and Crisis and not itself based on actual historical research) as an "amazing piece of historical 'empathy'" that nevertheless falls short of an adequate rendering of the meaning-intentional structure of modern symbolic mathematical physics. For Klein, that meaning-intentional structure is determined rather by a historical rupture, inaugurated by Vieta, Descartes, and others: the radical reinterpretation of the concept of number in ancient Greek mathematics.

In Part Two of his study, Hopkins treats Husserl's and Klein's approaches to the task of desedimenting the modern mathematization or symbolic idealization of nature. The essence of such symbolic idealization is the identification of the thing represented with the means of representation. Hopkins' thesis is that for Husserl, but not for Klein, the symbolic formations of modern mathematical physics nevertheless have an intuitive origin in the ontology of individual objects, and are therefore in principle subject to being "cashed in" in the intuition of the life-world: "That the formalized meaning-structures that characterize physics must refer to the natural world is never in doubt for Husserl" (87). Regarding the latter, Husserl's fragmentary attempt at the "reactivation" of the original meaning-bestowing activities by which what he calls "Galilean physics" was founded is well-known to readers of "The Origin of Geometry." The traditional science of geometry, perfected by the ancient Greeks, is based upon a progressive idealization of the concrete shapes encountered in the life-world. Galilean science then identifies these pure shapes of geometry with the "true shapes" of the natural world, even though our actual experience of the natural world never reveals such pure shapes. Moreover, Galilean science then discards all other sensuous modes of givenness, reducing the natural world to its geometrically idealized properties. By contrast, Klein's desedimentation, concentrates on the transformation of the Greek arithmosconcept and, on Hopkins' account at least, involves the rejection of Husserl's assumption that desedimenting symbolic meaning-formations is tantamount to cashing them in in the intuition of the life-world. That is because for Klein, the modern symbolic number concept bears within itself, in sedimented form, unclarified ontological assumptions of its origins.

In Part Three Hopkins provides an exhaustive analysis of Husserl's and Klein's investigations into the origin of symbolic numbers. Only a brief sketch is possible here. In Husserl's case, Hopkins focuses on the treatment of number in his Philosophy of Arithmetic (1891, hereafter PA). (In Part Four, Hopkins also treats later works such as Logical Investigations and Formal and Transcendental Logic, but concludes that in these works Husserl never substantively goes beyond the analysis of PA.) Husserl's account of number in PA distinguishes between "authentic" and "symbolic" number concepts, both of which are regarded by Husserl, at least initially, as referring ultimately to the same object, which Husserl calls a "multiplicity." Authentic numbers (cardinal numbers 2, 3, 4, etc.) are species of the concept of multiplicity; they are "authentic" because, according to Husserl, they refer directly to something directly intuitable, i.e., the countable as such. Thus, number has its origin in an act of abstraction by which we address the object as simply an "anything at all" and unify some particular assemblage of such anythings in what Husserl terms a "collective combination."

It can be a challenge for the reader of PA to determine whether for Husserl numbers are these collections themselves, taken "as collected" via reflection on a psychic act of abstraction, or, rather,concepts of such collections. For Hopkins, at least, the concept of number for Husserl has for its object a generality (the "anything whatever" as such) constituted through reflection on the act of abstraction. In the realm of symbolic numbers, by contrast, a sign substitutes for the actual concept of a multiplicity. Husserl starts out by attempting to interpret symbolic number concepts as "inauthentic," in the sense that the latter still intend the same object as the former even if we cannot "take it in" intuitively (large numbers, for instance). His final verdict on symbolic number concepts is that they are not genuine concepts at all (even "inauthentic" ones), but rather substitutes for concepts, constituted by calculational rules ("rules of the game," as Hopkins puts it) that take the place of thought. Hopkins' principal concern in analyzing Husserl's account of number in both PA and subsequent treatments is whether Husserl ever actually demonstrates the constitution of symbolic (or "signitive") numbers on the basis of an original in life-world intuition of authentic numbers. Hopkins' ultimate conclusion is that Husserl does not.

The remainder of Part Three is devoted to Klein's interpretation of the advent of the modern symbolic conception of number. I cannot begin to do justice to either the startling originality of Klein's analysis nor to the depth and comprehensiveness of Hopkins' interpretation. I shall merely highlight some of the more important elements in Klein's account that Hopkins identifies. Klein launches Greek Mathematical Thought with an analysis of the distinction between arithmetic and "logistic" in Greek mathematics. The touchstone of his account is that for Greek mathematics in general, a number (arithmos) is always a countable collection of units of a definite kind, and never itself a concept or generalized object. Thus, the hallmark of an arithmos is its complete definiteness -- a number is "just so many" of "just this kind" of units (apples, oranges, fruit, or in the case of arithmetical science, pure units accessible only to thought). "Logistic," or the art of calculation, on the other hand, makes demands on the concept of number that strain its ontological basis in collections of indivisible units or "pure monads." The practical logistician must calculate with fractions of the unit, and in so doing evidently violates the intelligibility of the number concept and therefore of the science of arithmetic itself.

This very challenge posed by the problem of "partitioning the unit" leads Aristotle to a solution that renders possible theoretical logistic of the type we encounter, for example, in Diophantine algebra. Aristotle's theory has its origin in a rejection of the Platonic chorismos doctrine, according to which the pure monads of arithmetical science exist separately from sensible matter. For Aristotle, the "separability" of number from matter arises rather from an act of abstraction by which we disregard everything in countable units except for their being countable. For Aristotle, then, the being of the object of the concept a number is still a definite collection of definite things, but these things (monads) are now the much stripped-down units resulting from our disregard of everything but their countability. Or, as he famously puts it in Metaphysics VI, while physics or natural science deals with things that exist inseparable from matter, and metaphysics or first philosophy deals with things that exist separate from matter, mathematics deals with things that cannot exist separate from matter, but regards them qua separate from matter. Thus, for Aristotle, the indivisibility of the unit of counting derives from its having been taken as the measure of counting, and the unity of a number itself (that is, its collective being as an assemblage of units) derives from its having been counted. This solves the problem of fractions by making the indivisibility of the monad a function of its having been arbitrarily chosen as the unit of counting (which can always be changed). In this manner the way is cleared for the theoretical logistic, or algebra, of Diophantus.[1]

Klein's reading of Diophantus' Arithmetic prepares us for his subsequent interpretation of Vieta's symbolic algebra as in origin a reinterpretation of Diophantine algebra, but on ontological assumptions foreign to Diophantus himself and Greek mathematics in general. This reading centers on the Diophantine notion of the number "species" (eidos). The Diophantine "species" is a class or general category of numbers whose determinate amount (three, four, and so forth) is yet to be determined (or has been left undetermined). The species is not itself a number and does not designate a general object; it has an undetermined object, but not an indeterminate object. (If I don't know how many eggs I have in the refrigerator, the number of eggs is undetermined while remaining completely determinate.) Rather, the species, represented symbolically by Diophantus (unknown, known, etc.) always signifies, in accord with the general Greek mathematical conception, a determinate amount of units of a determinate kind. That is to say, for Diophantus the algebraic variable or sign designates a general concept, but that general concept does not intend a general object. It is on the basis of the Diophantine conception of "species," but on radically different ontological assumptions, that Vieta will coin (in his Analytical Art of 1591) the modern symbolic concept of number. And this concept on Klein's view essentially determines the conception of nature in modern mathematical physics.

Hopkins proceeds next to Klein's desedimentation of Vieta's reinterpretation of the Diophantine procedure (along with subsequent innovations by Stevin, Descartes, and Wallis). This is Klein's real tour de force in Greek Mathematical Thought. The gist of it is that Vieta transforms the received (Greek) concept of arithmos, determined above all by a direct relation to its object (numbers themselves as collections of countable things in the world), into a symbolic conception the proximate object of which is "number in general," and whose relation to countable things in the world is therefore indirect. In the Vietan conception, that is, the Diophantine notion of "species" or "number in general" has been recast as the object of the true concept of number. Hereafter, a "number" is in its very being a generalized object, the possible value of an algebraic variable. At the same time, and this is the decisive point in Klein's analysis, the arithmetical intelligibility of symbolic numbers remains parasitic upon the received intelligibility of arithmos as a countable collection. This is because symbolic numbers, which are in the final analysis a certain kind of reified abstraction, are nevertheless subjected to arithmetical calculation as if they were collections of countable units. It is as if one were to add together the "concept of seven" and the "concept of five" and end up with twelve.

Herein lies the fundamental tension (or incoherence, if you like) uncovered by Klein's desedimentation: modern symbolic mathematics, the intelligibility of which derives from the received Greek concept of arithmos (as a collection of countable units), nevertheless violates that very intelligibility by setting up as its proximate object a general concept of number (e.g., "the number four" taken as an entity in its own right). At the hands of Descartes, finally, in a fateful development for all subsequent science, geometry itself, the traditional science of figures in space, is reinterpreted as a symbolic representation of generalized quantitative relationships or algebraic "equations" (think "graphing an equation" in your high school course on analytical geometry).

Hopkins' key interpretive insight here, in my view, is his careful unpacking of, and emphasis on, Klein's uncovering the decisive role of the written sign in the constitution of the being of symbolic number. It is not merely that in Vieta the thing signified by algebraic signs is a generalized object (unlike the object signified by Diophantine algebraic signs), but that the written sign enters in such a way as to render the modern symbolic conception of number self-referential in a very specific sense. As Hopkins puts it, "Vieta's letter as a sign -- in the novel sense of a symbol -- of an indeterminate magnitude does not signify anything but itself" (286, n.147). Modern symbolic number, then, is born when Vieta subjects his letter signs to syntactic rules, which symbolically constitute their own object as an object at all, while simultaneously maintaining the object's numerical character as an "amount" to be calculated upon.

In the fourth and last main part, Hopkins draws some conclusions regarding the relationship between Husserl's and Klein's accounts of the logic of symbolic mathematics, which I believe can be fairly summarized as follows.

1. Husserl fails to account for the meaning-structure of symbolic numbers because he assumes that the sense-genesis of symbolic numbers necessarily has its origin in authentic numbers, with the consequence that symbolic numbers at least in principle are susceptible to being "cashed in" intuitively. Furthermore, it seems to me that for Hopkins, Husserl's "authentic" numbers are in a certain sense already symbolic. This is because for Husserl (in contrast with Aristotle, who likewise views number as a certain product of abstraction, against Platonic separate forms) the object of the number concept is a generality ("anything whatever") rather than a definite amount of definite (albeit stripped down) units, as is the case for Aristotelian number. Husserl's analysis of number is therefore to a significant degree conducted from within the assumptions of the very modern horizon he is trying to criticize.

2. Klein succeeds in uncovering the meaning-structure of modern symbolic number and in doing so completes the project defined in Husserl's Crisis. Klein specifically shows that desedimentation does not necessarily yield a "cashing in" or redemption of symbolic meaning formations in intuition, since the object of the symbolic number concept is symbolic number itself. Therefore, Husserl's expressed goal of rendering intelligible the sense-history of modern mathematical science in terms of its intuitive origin in the life-world is misplaced given his framing of the problem. This is because Klein's actual historical investigation demonstrates the opposite -- the impossibility of such a life-world intuition.

While there is more to Hopkins' excellent study than I have been able to comment on, I would like to close with two concerns regarding the further development of Klein's ideas. The first has to do with the very concept of intuition and its relation to the empirical sense of symbolic mathematical physics. For Husserl, "intuition," as an immediate experiential encounter with the world has a normative sense, supplying a criterion for the intelligibility of concepts. A concept carries a valid or coherent sense only if it is grounded in an intuition of the life-world, either directly or indirectly. However, upon reflection it is not always so easy to distinguish this normative sense of "intuition" from the mere fact that any concept, valid or invalid, must in some sense have a sense-genesis in intuition of the life-world, otherwise we could never have formed the concept. For instance, how do theoretical entities in physics such as force fields pass the normative test of intuition? We have no direct intuition of force fields, but certainly the concepts of "force" and "field" are derived from life-world intuition, with their combination in the concept of "force field" being itself grounded in direct observation of the behavior of material bodies. The normative concept of intuition would seem to require that a concept indirectly grounded in intuition be one whose sense-genesis is at every step accompanied by directly intuited, present evidence. "Square circle," for instance, would be invalid or "impossible," since while both squares and circles are directly intuitable, their coincidence in a single plane figure is not. It is not entirely clear to me, however, where theoretical entities like force fields fall with respect to the normative test of intuitive origin in the life-world.

The normative conception of intuition is all the more in need of clarification if we take into account the possibility of direct but vague or confused intuitions, a possibility to which Husserl himself was certainly attuned. For instance, we mentioned above the direct intuition of "force" as a push or a pull. From a scientific standpoint, at least, notwithstanding its directness, there seems to be an inherent vagueness or even confusedness to this concept, assuming as it evidently does that all forces act by contact. After all, not only does the world by all appearances contain forces that do not act by contact, but the notion of contact itself becomes senseless at the microscopic level. In what sense, then, could the intuitive conception of force be normative for the science of physics? I believe this matter requires some careful attention if we are to bring Husserl's and Klein's method of desedimentation to bear upon modern mathematical physics, not least because Klein in Greek Mathematical Thought appears to distance himself from the philosophical notion of "intuition." He prefers to speak instead simply of a "natural" attitude to the world in which the cognitive relation to the intended object is unmediated by any symbolic abstraction:

However, one fundamental objection is to be raised immediately against stressing the "intuitive" character of the arithmos concept, namely, that it arises from a point of view whose criteria are taken not from Greek, but from modern symbolic mathematics. . . . The peculiarity of the Greek concept of "number" lies therefore less in an "archaic" or "intuitive" character (which is not at all its primary property) than in the kind of relation it has to the "thing" it intends.[2]

My second concern has to do with Hopkins' conclusion that Klein has demonstrated the impossibility in principle of intuitively "cashing in" symbolic mathematics in the life-world, either directly or indirectly. I am convinced neither that this is true nor that it is in fact Klein's view. In the first place, the claim has some serious implications for at least mathematical physics, if not for symbolic mathematics per se. Mathematical physics is, or at least claims to be, an empirical science. But if it neither has nor can have an intuitive grounding in the life-world, then by Klein's own lights it is no science at all, being a mere means of predicting and technologically manipulating the world. Indeed, near the conclusion of Greek Mathematical Thought, Klein asserts that the "nature" which serves as the object of Newton's mathematical science is nothing other than Cartesian symbolic space. This remark must surely be taken as an implicit critique of Newtonian science, since whatever the natural world is in its own being, it certainly is not a symbolic entity of any kind. Klein's analysis cries out for a remedy to the symbolic reification of the world, but if I understand Hopkins correctly, there is and can be no remedy, since symbolic mathematical concepts intend no object but themselves. At best, we could correlate those concepts to the experienced world, but they could never have an intelligible experiential meaning.

I think we must consider more carefully what it would mean to "cash in" the equations of modern mathematical physics intuitively. As we noted, such equations prescribe numerical operations that can be performed solely on symbolic-dimensionless numbers, thereby violating the very intelligibility of physical quantities, which are inherently dimensional. This, of course, raises the question of why algebraic physics works.

I would suggest that it could work only if the symbolic formations (signs) encode something that does carry intuitive sense, that is, if they are in fact a certain kind of abbreviation for intuitively coherent operations on dimensional quantities. Returning to our example of F=ma, it is indeed the case that the symbolic formation ma is devoid of any direct intuitive sense, violating as it does the very sense of multiplication as repeated addition. However, we know from the history of algebra that equations are, in their historical origin, symbolic translations or abbreviations of proportions among ratios. F=ma can be written as a proportion in an entirely intelligible way. In proportion notation, it is in fact a "conjoint proportion," as Newton called it, consisting of two distinct proportions: one equating the ratio of forces with the ratio of masses, and the other equating the ratio of forces with the ratio of accelerations. In this way, F=ma, a physically senseless string of symbols if taken conceptually, is intuitively redeemable indirectly by regarding it as a symbolic abbreviation for a physically intelligible proportion.

This is not to suggest, however, that all symbolic entities in modern mathematical physics can be intuitively redeemed this way. A priori, we can know neither that a given symbolic mathematical theory is intuitively redeemable (Husserl), nor that it is not (Hopkins). We cannot know until we actually attempt to desediment a specific theory. This is a daunting task for just about any contemporary theory of physics, since the symbolic sedimentations with which such theories are laden typically come in layer upon layer, and require for their interpretation not just specialized historical knowledge, but specialized mathematical knowledge as well. As it is, one can only agree with Husserl that modern mathematical science "takes for true being what is actually a method." Should it turn out that there is no remedy for this situation, we are in trouble indeed. For in that case, we arguably inhabit a civilization in perpetual Husserlian "crisis," founded upon a science that literally does not know what it is about.

[1]Due to space limitations, I unfortunately have had to entirely skip over Hopkins' intricate analysis of Plato's challenging theory of "eidetic numbers."

[2] Klein, Jacob. Greek Mathematical Thought and the Origin of Algebra, trans. Eva Brann (New York: Dover, 1968), 63.