The Origins of Analytic Philosophy: Kant and Frege

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Delbert Reed, The Origins of Analytic Philosophy: Kant and Frege, Continuum, 2007, 203pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826493378.

Reviewed by Jeremy Heis, University of California, Irvine


Historians of philosophy, Delbert Reed tells us in the opening pages of this book, have recently come to recognize that early analytic philosophy developed largely in reaction to Kant. In keeping with this trend, Reed hopes to address a gap in our understanding of the origins of analytic philosophy by exploring Frege's relation to Kant. At first, this task might seem not too pressing, since Frege explicitly discusses Kant's philosophy only once -- though famously -- in his 1884 Foundations of Arithmetic. There Frege argues, against Kant, that the truths of arithmetic are not based on intuition but are analytic a priori, and that logic can in fact extend our knowledge. But the references to Kant and his vocabulary virtually disappear from Frege's works after 1884. And it is not clear that Frege's engagement with Kant in Foundations is all that sophisticated: after all, the few passages from Kant's writings that Frege cites are from a popular reader of excerpted philosophical classics.

Nevertheless, many scholars writing on Frege and Kant have found a host of interesting connections between the two.[1] (Unfortunately, Reed's discussion of the secondary literature on Kant and Frege is rather thin. This is likely to frustrate those already engaged in the study of Kant or early analytic philosophy.) For the most part, Reed understandably focuses on the passages in the Foundations of Arithmetic where Frege explicitly criticizes Kant. The book tends to alternate between section-by-section discussions of Frege's texts and paragraph-by-paragraph discussions of corresponding passages in Kant's opera. After an introduction summarizing the contents of the book, Reed begins in Part 1 with an overview of the Doctrines of Concepts, Judgments, and Inferences in Kant's Logic, and then moves on to a summary of the Preface and first Part of Frege's Begriffsschrift. Part 2 concerns Kant's philosophy of arithmetic in the first Critique. Part 3 briefly covers Frege's arguments in Foundations that arithmetic is analytic and that logic can be epistemically ampliative. Part 4 (titled "From substance to object") is the longest and most interesting. There, Reed explores the complex relation of various Kantian and Fregean doctrines to an Aristotelian metaphysics of substances -- represented in the modern period by Leibniz.

Given the format of the book, I'm going to avoid a chapter-by-chapter summary and discussion. Instead, I'll start with a general comment and then take up a few more specific interpretive claims found in Part 4.

First the general comment. Reed's approach -- run through some text of Frege's, and then compare a corresponding passage in Kant -- has its advantages, especially for those readers not already intimately familiar with the texts. But it also has a danger, that not enough attention will be paid to an important preliminary concern: whether Frege and Kant really are answering the same question or employing their vocabularies in ways close enough to make a comparison fruitful. Let me illustrate. Frege thought that existence is not a first-level concept like is human or is prime, but a second-level concept true of any first-level concept under which at least one object falls. Kant argued, against proponents of the ontological argument, that existence is not a "real predicate, i.e., a concept of something that could add to the concept of a thing" (A598/B626). Reed thinks that Frege thus "follows Kant and treats existence as a second-level concept" (169-170). But Frege couldn't be following Kant in treating existence as a second-level concept: Kant did not have the concept/object distinction and did not think of reality as typed. (For Kant, concepts are a particular kind of representation and objects are what our representations refer to. For Frege, concepts and objects are not representations, but different types of things that our expressions refer to -- the former being "unsaturated," the latter "saturated.") This is not to say that there are not interesting analogies between the positions. But one at least needs to recognize and address head-on the plain fact that "Begriff" and "Gegenstand" do not mean the same things in Kant's and Frege's mouths. Examples multiply. For Kant, a judgment is analytic when its predicate concept is contained in its subject concept; for Frege, a truth is analytic when it can be proven logically from definitions and logical laws. For Kant, logic is (perhaps by definition?) formal and so "logical object" is a contradiction in terms; for Frege, logic is not formal and has its own objects. Generations of commentators, from Frege's earliest Kantian readers to contemporary scholars, have wondered how precisely to isolate the genuine disagreements. Reed seems to me too quickly to assume that Frege and Kant are not talking past one another.

Now three specific comments. At various points in the book, Reed considers Frege's claim (Foundations §88) that Kant was wrong to think that logic (and thus analytic judgments) cannot extend our knowledge. He thinks Frege's claim amounts to a rejection of Kant's view that logic is formal (14, 114). Reed also equates this claim with Frege's suggestion that the Begriffsschrift has realized Leibniz's dream of a "characteristic language" (35-7). But these three Fregean theses are distinct:

(1) The Begriffsschrift is able to express the contents of sentences more perspicuously than in natural language by constructing the signs for compound concepts from the signs for their constituent concepts. (That is, the Begriffsschrift is a characteristic language.)[2]

(2) Judgments of pure logic (and so, analytic judgments) can extend our knowledge.[3]

(3) Logic is not formal: it does not abstract from the content of all concept expressions and does not treat all singular terms as mutually interchangeable.[4]

Failure to keep these theses distinct obscures our understanding of both Frege and Kant. We find Frege arguing for (1) and (2) as early as 1880-1. Yet during this same period, Frege seems still to hold the Kantian view that logic is formal.[5] Recognizing this is important, since Frege's reasons for adopting (3) depend on his post-1884 theory of numbers as objects and on his mature semantics from the 1890s. Similarly, Kant has distinct reasons for denying each of the three theses. Kant rejected the possibility of a characteristic language from early in his career, for reasons independent of the critical doctrines.[6] Inasmuch as he can be read as rejecting (2), it is because Kant sees analytic judgments as making explicit implicit containment relations among concepts. And he rejects (3) because of the conjunction of his critical distinction between intuiting and thinking and his distinctively critical doctrine that all of the content of our representations depends on there being objects that affect us through sensibility.[7]

The topic of Part 4 of the book is Kant's and Frege's relation to the metaphysics of substance endorsed by Aristotle and (in a quite different way) by Leibniz. Reed's principal conclusions are four. First, Frege "escapes the shackles of the metaphysics of inherence" by rejecting the subject-predicate analysis of judgments and thereby treating a "relational expression as designating a real relation between two objects" (124). Second, Frege's syntactic characterization of objects as the Bedeutung of proper names frees Frege from the "traditional distinction between substance and attribute, with its accompanying conception of the ontological dependence of attributes upon substances" (123). Third, Kant, unlike Frege, holds that all relations among real objects must be reducible to internal properties of substances, and Kant uses this principle to prove the ideality of space and time (8-11, 134, 159-60). Fourth, Kant, like Leibniz, thinks that relations must be reducible to internal properties because he lacks "an adequate logic of relations" (10). Frege, in providing a system of polyadic logic, undercuts the motivation for the axiom of internal relations and thereby "a central component in Kant's argument for transcendental idealism" (10).

Let's consider the third and fourth conclusions. Reed attributes to Kant the following argument (8, 10, 134, 160):

[R] Since spatial relations are not reducible to internal properties of their relata, space is not real but ideal. Therefore, the things in space are ideal, not real.

For Reed, this argument relies on the principle, defended by Leibniz and famously attacked by Russell, of the reducibility of relations:

All of the relations of a real object are reducible to internal properties of those objects.

Reed thinks that Kant was driven to adopt the principle of the reducibility of relations because of the limitations of the logic available to him. Given the role of the principle in [R], Reed therefore concludes that Kant draws "a metaphysical and epistemological conclusion based largely upon a limitation of formal logic" (134). Reed sometimes writes (8-11) as if this reading of Kant is the same as that put forward by Michael Friedman.[8] According to Friedman's Kant, conceptual representations are all expressible in Aristotelian, monadic logic. Since monadic logic cannot express the existence of an infinity of mathematical objects, Friedman's Kant concludes that there are true mathematical judgments not expressible using conceptual representations, and mathematics is synthetic. However, despite the superficial similarity between his reading and Friedman's, Reed's reconstruction of Kant really is entirely new. (Friedman's Kant never suggests that Kant's argument depends on any thesis about the metaphysics of relations.)

It requires substantial work to attribute [R] to Kant. Kant never explicitly endorses the principle of the reducibility of relations in the first Critique, and many commentators have reasonably denied that Kant endorses this Leibnizian thesis.[9] Reed, on the other hand, thinks he finds [R] in B 66-7. Kant writes:

For confirmation of this theory of the ideality of outer as well as inner sense, thus of all objects of the senses, as mere appearances, this comment is especially useful: that everything in our cognition that belongs to intuition … contains nothing but mere relations … Now through mere relations no thing in itself is cognized: it is therefore right to judge that since nothing is given to us through outer sense except mere representations of relation, outer sense can also contain in its representation only the relation of an object to the subject, and not that which is internal to the object itself.

But this passage does not endorse the principle of the reducibility of relations. Rather, it relies on a weaker principle -- that every real object must have at least some internal properties; that is, that there could not be a real object all of whose properties are relations. To see how much weaker this principle is, recall that Russell, that great foe of the principle of the reducibility of relations, in fact endorses this weaker thesis. In Principles of Mathematics he argues (against Dedekind's "structuralist" account of arithmetic) that it cannot be the case that all of the properties of the numbers are relations to other numbers. If the numbers "are anything at all," Russell argues, "they have to be intrinsically something" (§242). Furthermore, despite what Reed holds, Kant's reasons for endorsing this weaker thesis, as he makes clear in the "Amphiboly," have nothing to do with the limitations of Aristotelian formal logic. Instead, Kant argues that an object that exists in itself must exist independently of other objects; but if all of its properties were relations to other objects, its existence would depend on them (A265/B321, A283-4/B339-40, A435/B463; Ak 20:284-5; cp. Ak 1:481).[10] Space, all of whose properties are relations between its parts, violates this weaker principle and is thus ideal.

In any case, one might wonder why any of this should be in a book that is principally about Frege. It is true, of course, that Frege showed no anxiety about reducing all the relational sentences in Begriffsschrift to sentences containing only monadic sentences. But this is not because Frege was aware of the metaphysical arguments for the reducibility of relations and had some refutation of them. Unlike Russell, whose upbringing in Bradleian metaphysics had left him "filled with the importance of relations,"[11] Frege seems to have been in many respects innocent of traditional philosophical debates, and it distorts his motivations to attribute to him explicitly metaphysical concerns. Perhaps Reed thinks that Frege's technical innovations by themselves undercut the "traditional" metaphysics of substance and attribute. Maybe so, but Reed does not explain why. (Russell, who -- like Reed -- attributes the axiom of internal relations to Kant, never suggests that it is the new logic that undermines the axiom.)

One last comment. Reed argues that Kant would reject the Fregean doctrine that we can know that there are mathematical objects that are causally inert and do not exist in space and time. Clearly, the question of the nature and status of mathematical objects in Kant's philosophy is complex and controversial. Nevertheless, many readers will be sympathetic to Reed's view that Kant is committed to rejecting a Fregean platonism about mathematical objects for the same reasons that Kant is committed to rejecting the possibility of our knowing noumena. However, given his attribution of [R] to Kant, Reed thinks that Kant's objection to the knowability of noumena, and thus to a platonism like Frege's, is based on features of traditional logic (159). But Kant's most general argument against the possibility of our knowing noumena, first announced in the famous 1772 letter to Herz, is this. Since they are not given in sensible intuition, noumena do not cause our representations of them. But neither do we produce these objects through our representations. And so it is completely unclear how we could ever come to refer to them. As the last thirty-five years of discussions stemming from Benacerraf's work in the philosophy of mathematics have shown, this is a prima facie compelling thought that threatens the tenability of a theory of mathematical objects like Frege's. This isn't to say that this Kantian argument is a good one, or that there are not resources in Frege's texts for answering it. But readers of Kant and Frege who are looking to understand this issue, as well as the others I've already mentioned in this review, will probably want to look elsewhere.


Allison, Henry E. "Incongruence and Ideality." Topoi 3 (1984): 169-175.

Brandom, Robert. Tales of the Mighty Dead: Historical Essays in the Metaphysics of Intentionality. Cambridge: HUP, 2002.

Burge, Tyler. Truth, Thought, Reason: Essays on Frege. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2005.

Buroker, Jill. Space and Incongruence: The Origin of Kant's Idealism. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1981.

Dummett, Michael. "Frege and Kant on Geometry." In his Frege and Other Philosophers. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1991.

Frege, Gottlob. "Boole's logical Calculus and the Concept-script." In Posthumous Writings. Edited by Hans Hermes, Friedrich Kambartel, and Friedrich Kaulbach. Translated by Peter Long and Roger White. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1979.

Frege, Gottlob. Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik. Eine logisch-mathematische Untersuchung über den Begriff der Zahl. Breslau: Koebner, 1882. Translated by Austin as The Foundations of Arithmetic. Oxford: Blackwell, 1950.

Frege, Gottlob. "On the Foundations of Geometry: Second Series." Collected Papers on Mathematics, Logic, and Philosophy. Edited by Brian McGuiness and translated by Max Black, V. H. Dudman, Peter Geach, Hans Kaal, E. -- H. Kluge, Brian McGuiness, and R. H. Stoothof. New York: Basil Blackwell, 1984.

Frege, Gottlob. "On the Scientific Justification of the Concept-script." In Conceptual Notation and Related Articles. Translated by Terrell Ward Bynum. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1972.

Friedman, Michael. Kant and the Exact Sciences. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1992.

Kant, Immanuel. Critique of Pure Reason. Translated by Paul Guyer and Allen Wood. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.

Kant, Immanuel. Gesammelte Schriften. Edited by the Königlich Preußischen Akademie der Wissenschaft. 29 vols. Berlin: DeGruyter, 1902-.

Langton, Rae. Kantian Humility: Our Ignorance of Things in Themselves. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1998.

Longuenesse, Beatrice. Kant and the Capacity to Judge. Translated by Charles Wolfe. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1998.

MacFarlane, John. "Frege, Kant, and the Logic in Logicism." Philosophical Review 111 (2000): 25-65.

Paton, H. J. Kant's Metaphysic of Experience: A Commentary on the First Half of the Kritik der reinen Vernunft. 2 vols. 2nd ed. London: Macmillan, 1951.

Russell, Bertrand. My Philosophical Development. London: George Allen, 1959.

Russell, Bertrand. The Principles of Mathematics. 2nd ed. New York: Norton, 1938. The first edition appeared in 1903.

Sluga, Hans. Gottlob Frege. Boston: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1980.

[1] Here's an incomplete list. Hans Sluga, Tyler Burge, and Robert Brandom have all seen in Frege an echo of Kant's principle of the priority of judgment (A68/B93). Dummett and others have noted that Frege, apparently throughout his career, sides with Kant (against Russell) in thinking that geometry is synthetic a priori and rests on intuition. Sluga has claimed that this conception of geometry commits Frege to some form of transcendental idealism; others have demurred. Beatrice Longuenesse has argued that Kant's definition of number belongs "to the path that leads" to Frege's view that the content of a statement about number is an assertion about a concept (Kant and the Capacity to Judge, 257-8). John MacFarlane, in a widely read paper, shows how and why Frege and Kant, though sharing a conception of logic as general, come to disagree on whether logic is formal. (Reed does not mention any of these discussions.)

[2] See, in particular, Frege's 1880-1 paper "Boole's logical Calculus and the Concept-script."

[3] See "Boole's logical Calculus and the Concept-script" [1880-1], 33-4; Foundations of Arithmetic [1884], sections 17 and 88.

[4] See "On the Foundations of Geometry: Second Series" [1906], 338 (original German edition, 427-8).

[5] "On the Scientific Justification of the Concept-script" [1882], 89.

[6] New Elucidation [1755]: Ak 1:390; cf. Inquiry Concerning the Distinctness of the Principles of Natural Theology and Morality [1764]: Ak 2:278-9.

[7] MacFarlane, "Frege, Kant, and the Logic in Logicism."

[8] Kant and the Exact Sciences.

[9] See Paton, vol. 1, 135-6; Allison. Rae Langton, in a rich and detailed discussion, has gone one step further. She thinks that Kant throughout his career denies the reducibility thesis, and that this denial is an essential premise in Kant's arguments that we are ignorant of things as they are in themselves. Jill Buroker, on the other hand, does think that Kant endorses the principle, and that he uses it implicitly in his argument for transcendental idealism based on the possibility of incongruent counterparts. Reed does not discuss any of these works.

[10] For a fuller defense of this reading, see Langton, 102 et passim.

[11] Russell, My Philosophical Development, 56.