The Origins of the Philosophy of Symbolic Forms: Kant, Hegel, and Cassirer

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Donald Phillip Verene, The Origins of the Philosophy of Symbolic Forms: Kant, Hegel, and Cassirer, Northwestern University Press, 2011, 168pp., $69.95 (hbk) ISBN 9780810127784.

Reviewed by S. G. Lofts, King's at the Western University


In the Preface to his book, Verene sets out the questions his work aims to address, the methodological approach it will employ and the central thesis to be argued. There are two connected questions: "How did Cassirer reach the original philosophical position for which he is famous? What are the fundamentals of this philosophy?" (xii) Verene proposes to adopt Cassirer's own "genetic method" in his reading of Cassirer's oeuvre. For Cassirer, Verene states, "the primary way to understand any human production is to grasp how it came to be what it is. This approach is not merely to relate its history but to obtain a grasp of its 'inner form.'" (xii) Finally, the central thesis of the work maintains that"Cassirer's philosophy of symbolic forms cannot be understood apart from a dialectic between Kantian and Hegelian philosophy that lies within it. Kant and Hegel are the master keys to the comprehension of Cassirer's philosophy." (xii) Verene's central claim throughout this work is that Cassirer is not only guided by Hegel's conception of "phenomenology" but that it provides the essential philosophical core of the philosophy of symbolic forms, notwithstanding the fact that Cassirer rejected the logocentrism of Hegel's "system" that sublates all reality into the reality of logic and subsequently rejected Hegel's concepts of the Aufhebung and the Absolute. Though Verene's focus is limited to Kant and Hegel, he acknowledges the existence of a "large secondary cast" that has influenced the development of Cassirer's thought. In particular, he draws our attention to what he sees as the special importance of Goethe, suggesting that although it is beyond the scope of his investigation "there is a separate study to be written of Goethe's influence on Cassirer." (xiii)

The reader not familiar with Cassirer's "genetic method" will most likely not be able to appreciate its importance for the overall structure of the book as Verene provides no further explanation of this methodology. In short, as Cassirer articulates it, though this is never quoted by Verene, we must return from the "forma formata" to the "formaformans"; in other words, we must move from that which "has become" to the "very principle of becoming." (Cf. Form und Technik, 43) Cassirer's genetic-reconstructive method begins with the concrete objective expressions of spirit, what Cassirer calls the "work" (Werk) of culture, and through a critical analysis of these crystalline formations (Gebilden) seeks their condition of possibility in the lawful structures of the effective activity (wirken) of spirit that form (bilden) and configure (gestalten) them, what Cassirer calls the "inner form" of the work. Each symbolic form undertakes the formation (Bildung) and configuration (Gestaltung) of reality (Wirklichkeit) according to its own unique laws. The genetic-reconstructive method, thus, focuses on the genesis of historical manifestations of each symbolic form in the dynamic process of their objectivization, and attempts to reconstruct the inner lawful form of this dynamic process. Cassirer's critique of culture seeks to understand each of the symbolic forms in terms of its function within the "unity" (Einheit) of the integral "whole" (Ganzheit) of culture.

When we turn to the overall structure of Verene's book, we see that it progresses historically through a reading of a small selection of Cassirer's works. Each chapter is centeredaround a specific historical product (Gebilde) and develops a specific fundamental element of Cassirer's philosophy, subsequently determining its function within the whole of Cassirer's thought as it historically unfolds. Chapter 1 begins with a reading of volume one of the Philosophy of Symbolic Forms (1923), which treats language as a symbolic form and contextualizes Cassirer's project as a transformation of Kant's critique of pure reason into a critique of culture. Beginning this way, Verene sets language as the central symbolic form in Cassirer's understanding of culture. Chapter 2 undertakes a reading of the second volume of the Philosophy of Symbolic Forms (1925), which is dedicated to the structure of mythical consciousness. As Verene wants to bring out the Hegelian dimension of Cassirer's project, he interprets myth as the first step on the "ladder" of scientific consciousness. Verene continues this line of argument in Chapter 3, which focuses on the third volume of the Philosophy of Symbolic Forms (1929) in which Cassirer does, in fact, undertake a "phenomenology of knowledge" -- phenomenology understood, here, in the Hegelian and not in the Husserlian sense of the term. In the middle of this chapter, Verene digresses and provides a brief presentation of the Cassirer-Heidegger debate at Davos.

Chapter 4 turns to the notes and fragments that were to make up the fourth volume of the Philosophy of Symbolic Forms which Cassirer never completed and which were published as Volume I of Cassirer's Nachgelassene Manuskripte und Texte (1995). The central aim of this chapter is to bring out the metaphysics of the symbolic forms through an analysis of the "basis phenomena" and the dialectic between life and spirit that stands at the heart of Cassirer's view of culture as a drama. The chapter ends with an attack on post-modern thought, as it is understood by Verene, for its anti-metaphysical tendencies: "Such thinking," Verene states, "is simply unable to make the Socratic turn to contemplation and so can never experience its grasp of truth, goodness, and beauty as an integral part of the human." (72) Chapter 5 focuses upon Cassirer's 1942 work, The Logic of the Cultural Sciences. Here, Verene provides a short account of Cassirer's distinction between the concepts of nature and concepts of culture as well as a brief look at Cassirer's response to George Simmel's "tragedy of culture." Verene begins to bring things together in Chapter 6, which examines An Essay on Man (1944) and provides some reflections on the evolution and consistency of Cassirer's thought as well as the nature of its unity. Finally, Chapter 7 is organized around Cassirer's last published work, Myth of the State (1946), which appeared shortly after his death. In this chapter, Verene develops the view that politics is a symbolic form; he also provides some reflections on the relation of philosophy to politics as well as the consequences of this for ethics, human freedom and the nature and role of the state.

While there is a large body of work on the Kantian and neo-Kantian elements of Cassirer's philosophy, there are not very many in-depth studies on Cassirer's engagement with Hegel. As Verene has published on Hegel and worked on Cassirer for over 40 years, this work promises to fill an important lacuna in Cassirer studies. However, the reader will no doubt be disappointed since Verene's study is filled with its own lacunae and in the end it does not actualize its potential.

The problem is not with Verene's central thesis (this has been clear for some time now), nor with what he says, but with what he does not say. For a book that seeks to demonstrate the importance of Hegel to Cassirer's thought, there are a shocking number of very important statements by Cassirer himself concerning his engagement with Hegel and a number of technical terms shared by Cassirer and Hegel that are never mentioned in Verene's book. What is more, Verene skips quickly from one statement to another, rarely taking the time to develop a point in greater detail.

Verene is correct that Cassirer rejects Hegel's "moment" (Moment) of "absolute knowledge" and thus any notion of a final Aufhebung; however, at the same time, it would seem that Cassirer nevertheless does employ Hegel's concept of the Aufhebung in his analysis of myth: taking it up, as he does so many of his technical terms, and transforming its meaning in so doing. What is more, while Cassirer rejects the moment of absolute knowledge, this cannot be equated with a rejection of the Absolute, as Verene mistakenly does. In the moment of the Aufhebung, differences are negated, preserved and taken up into a higher reality -- thus, negating an ontological difference and subjecting it to a higher ontological identity. In the case of myth, this happens when it "levels down" the distinction between image and reality. "Here [in myth], a law that one might call the law of leveling down (Nivellierung), the obliteration of specific differences prevails." (Myth and Language, 151: my translation) Thus, as Verene points out, the dancer does not "represent" the god but is the "presentation" of the god; in fact, is the god itself (39); "The god, once symbolized, is actualized." (40) What Verene does not recognize is that for Cassirer the relation between language and myth contains a moment of Aufhebung. Mythical consciousness constitutes a form of identity thinking based upon a logic of fusion that amounts to a form of sublation (Aufhebung).

At the heart of Cassirer's account of mythical consciousness is a theory of the "cult" which, with Hegel, he sees as "man's active relation to the gods" (PSF, II 219/262). The aim of the cult "consists in overcoming the separation of the I from the Absolute." (PSF, II 220/263) In the words of Hegel, which Cassirer quotes and which appear nowhere inVerene's work:

To give actuality (wirklich) to this unity, the reconciliation, restoration of the subject, and his self-consciousness, to bring about a positive feeling of sharing and participation in the Absolute and a unity with it -- this sublation (Aufhebung) of the rupture constitutes the sphere of cult.[1]

Thus, cult is for Hegel and Cassirer, "the eternal process of the subject making itself identical with the essence of its being."[2] In other words, the cult is a process of identification ruled by a logic of negation, insofar as difference is negated in order to establish the homogeneous unity of a real identity between the finite and the Absolute.

However, this sublation (Aufhebung) that levels down (Nivellierung) difference, thus negating alterity, and subjecting it to an idea, is never itself absolute. It is "religious intuition" that awakens the awareness of "alterity" of the Absolute and destroys the illusional harmony of mythical identity: "If this involvement and opposition were ever replaced by a pure and perfect equilibrium, the inner tension of religion, on which rests its significance as a symbolic form, would be sublated (aufgehoben)." (PSF, II 260/311) It is Hegel's idea of a final and ultimate sublation (Aufhebung) that would reduce all "alterity" to the presence of the idea that Cassirer rejects and, thus, not the mechanism of thesublation (Aufhebungper se. In his critique of Hegel, Cassirer writes:

For the balance of forces that he wished to establish proves in Hegel to be only an illusion. Hegel's aspiration and philosophical ambition was to reconcile "nature" and "idea." But instead of this reconciliation he arrives at the subjugation of nature to the absolute idea. Nature retains nothing in her own right; she possesses only an apparent independence. All her being she holds in fee from the idea; for she is nothing but the idea itself, insofar as this latter is considered not in its absolute being and truth, but in alienation from itself, in its "alterity." Here lies the true Achilles heel of the Hegelian system. It was not able to withstand for long the attacks that were directed against this point with increasing force. (Logic, 35/35)

In Cassirer's "system" spirit remains internally split. Language, myth, art, religion and science never culminate in one particular symbolic form: there is no precedence of scientific rationality over myth, or for that matter, over any other objective manifestation of spirit. It is this inherent heterogeneity within spirit that distinguishes Cassirer's phenomenology of culture from Hegel's phenomenology of spirit. For Hegel the different cultural forms culminate in absolute knowledge:

it is here that the spirit gains the pure element of its existence, the concept. All the earlier stages it has passed through are, to be sure, preserved as factors in this culminate state, but by being reduced to mere factors they are, on the other hand, negated. Of all the cultural forms, only that of logic, the concept, cognition, seems to enjoy a true and authentic autonomy. (PSF, I 83/15)

By contrast, in the philosophy of symbolic forms "the particular cultural trends do not move peacefully side by side, seeking to complement one another; each becomes what it is only by demonstrating its own particular power against the others in battle with the others" (PSF, I 82/13). At the heart of culture, there is found a primordial strife that is originary of the relationship between I and world that simultaneously differentiates and unites them.

This said, each of the symbolic forms is a specific moment (Moment) of the symbolic function of "symbolic pregnance", therefore forming a unity of a whole. Cassirer employs the term "moment" throughout his work and almost certainly takes it from Hegel; the German term, Moment, can be translated as "moment," as in a moment in time, or as "element," as in an element of a structure. Cassirer, like Hegel, plays on the double meaning. Thus, "the worldview of myth and of theoretical knowledge cannot coexist in the same area of thought. They are mutually exclusive: the beginning of one is equivalent to the end of the other." (PSF, III 76) And yet, Cassirer continues "the world of spirit forms a very concrete unity" the negation of the contents of mythical consciousness does not signify the end of the spiritual function and power that brought them about: this potency survives and continues to act in a new form within the concrete totality of spirit. It is at this point that Cassirer quotes Hegel: "'The life of the present (gegenwärtigen) spirit,' writes Hegel in this connection, 'is a cycle of stage which on the one hand still subsists side by side and only on the other hand appears as past. The moments/elements (Momente) which the spirit seems to have left behind it are also present in its depths." (PSF, III 76: translation modified)

Finally, it would have been very interesting to have explored Hegel's and Cassirer's uses of such terms as: "wirken," "Wirklichkeit," "Entfremdung" among others. Cassirer has a theory of action that is clearly developed form his engagement with Hegel. Verene never enters into a discussion of the nuanced difference between such German terms as effective action (wirken), doing (Tun), activity (Tätigkeit), action (Handlung) an act (Akt). It was not my intention here to provide a complete account of the subtle relationship between Hegel's and Cassirer's philosophical projects; but to provide a few concrete examples of the many important instances in Cassirer's texts where his engagement with Hegel is clearly manifested but which are largely absent in Verene's account.

There is one last lacuna that demands mention. When Verene puts forward the idea, to cite but one example of many, of the importance of Goethe and the opportunity for a separate study on Goethe's influence on Cassirer, one wonders why Verene has not mentioned John M. Krois who, it is well known, has always insisted on the importance of Goethe for Cassirer. The footnotes of Verene's work are filled with such lacunae.

[1] Hegel, Vorlesungen über die Philosophie der ReligionWerk, vol. 15, 67. Cited by Cassirer in PSF II, 220.

[2] Ibid.