The Oxford Handbook of Animal Ethics

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Tom L. Beauchamp and R. G. Frey (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Animal Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2011, 982pp., $175.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195371963

Reviewed by Peter Wenz, University of Illinois at Springfield


This handsomely bound volume is a welcome addition to the literature on animal ethics. Its thirty-five articles include traditional approaches to animal ethics -- utilitarian, contractarian, and Kantian -- as well as more recent contributions that highlight virtue, ecology, and literature. Claims that animals deserve or do not deserve moral consideration are debated in articles that appeal to the philosophy of mind and to cognitive ethology. Finally, several articles discuss issues concerning human uses of and interactions with animals -- zoos, pets, medical experiments, hunting, agriculture, and the creation of chimeras and genetically modified organisms. The text of each article is between 10 and 36 pages, making each suitable for reading in a single sitting. The Introduction contains useful summaries of all the articles and indicates quite correctly that these articles were not written for a general audience; they are for people doing serious philosophy.

There is not enough space in this review to make meaningful comment about most of the articles, so let me just say that the first two articles are on the history of animal ethics in ancient and in early-modern philosophy. They are quite well done.

Like several of the articles, Christine Korsgaard's excellent Kantian contribution discusses the differences between human beings and (nonhuman) animals to determine morally relevant differences that affect the extent to which animal life or welfare should be of direct moral concern. A major difference discussed by Korsgaard and some others in the volume is self-consciousness. Many animals can perceive the world and exercise causal reasoning about it, but, so far as we know, only people can identify their own desires and thought processes, criticize these desires and thought processes, and attempt to change them. For these reasons, only human beings are moral agents in the Kantian sense.

The bottom rung on the ladder toward self-awareness and moral responsibility is often thought to be the ability to recognize oneself in a mirror. Korsgaard properly distances herself from placing much emphasis on this test, as less visual animals, such as tigers, may identify themselves through a sense other than sight, and most social animals would seem to have some sense of self in order to act in ways that are appropriate to their places in their social order (101).

Korsgaard's signal contribution to the debate about our treatment of animals is that the respect we have for human beings on the Kantian basis of their being moral agents requires that we respect the bodies of those human beings, "the self for whom, or from whose standing view, things can be naturally good or bad." Sentient animals also have this kind of natural self, so Kantians should accord them some claim, although a lesser claim than moral agents, to moral consideration in their own right (108).

R. G. Frey's account of the relationship between utilitarianism and animals comes to just about the same conclusion. Frey rejects Peter Singer's views on animals because, Frey claims, Singer focuses too much on pleasures and pains in people and animals and not enough on the overall richness of lives. Judged on the basis of richness, people tend to have much more valuable lives than do most animals. An important constituent of such richness is the set of abilities that make most people moral agents. Frey acknowledges this claim to be a Kantian element in his reasoning (191). Because he retains the utilitarian element of caring about pleasures, pains, and the general quality of experience regardless of species, he rejects speciesism and agrees with Korsgaard that animals are morally considerable in their own right.

Frey's emphasis on the richness of life being enhanced through membership in a moral community with reciprocal obligations (191) connects his utilitarianism to contractarianism as well. However, Frey rejects the claim made by some contractarians (including Peter Carruthers in this volume) that animals are not of direct moral importance. But when push comes to shove, Frey thinks that utilitarians should almost always prefer human welfare because of the richer lives that humans typically lead. Hence, unlike some other utilitarians, Frey does not clearly reject factory farms, medical experimentation with animals, zoos, or any other currently controversial uses of animals for human welfare.

The warrant for Frey's embrace of a utilitarian standard closer to that of J.S. Mill than to that of Jeremy Bentham (and Peter Singer) is methodologically opaque. It leads to conclusions that support what many people consider common sense, but growing up in the racially segregated South, Frey rejects common practice (and presumably the associated common sense) as appropriate moral standards. Perhaps Frey is just appealing to his (and our) intuitions. However, from a utilitarian perspective, are such intuitions any better than common sense and common moral practice as guides to conduct?

Contractarianism, the third major perspective in normative ethics in our time, is related to animal issues by Peter Carruthers, who rejects the direct moral considerability of animals. He has two arguments. The first is a reductio ad absurdum. He argues on the basis of some interesting concepts in the philosophy of mind that even insects have propositional attitudes and that utilitarians concerned to maximize preference satisfaction are therefore required by consistency to include insect welfare in their calculations. Taking this result to be absurd, he rejects the utilitarian standard. I am not competent to assess the soundness of this argument.

Carruther's second argument, by contrast, his contractarian argument, is transparently flawed. He argues that if all morality stems, as he believes it does, from a hypothetical contract among self-interested moral agents, the contract cannot include animals as direct subjects of morality because animals are incapable of the kind of moral reasoning and reciprocal restraint required of contractors. But how can all of morality stem from the contract? Carruthers notes that according to Scanlon's contractarianism, "moral rules are those that no rational agent could reasonably reject who shared (as his or her highest priority) the aim of reaching free and unforced general agreement on the rules that are to govern behavior." (385) This aim is obviously a moral one, so at least one moral principle precedes the contract; all morality cannot stem from the contract. Rawls's version of contractarianism also requires moral commitments to precede the contract. To get off the ground, Rawls's contractarianism requires general acceptance of the moral rule that one should obey the dictates of one's (hypothetical) contract. This moral rule is a condition of making the contract, not a result of the contract. And if one moral position is independent of the contract, others could be as well, including the position that animals are of moral importance in their own right.

Carruthers acknowledges in a footnote that neither Scanlon nor Rawls continued to believe (if they ever believed) that all morality could be derived from a contract. But Carruthers does not address the reasons for this view, much less does he justify differing from them. So, he is aware of a potentially fatal flaw in his reasoning and purposely ignores this flaw, seeming to hope that his readers won't notice. This is the strategy of an advocate, a lobbyist, or a lawyer pleading for a client, not of a philosopher from whom we expect greater intellectual honesty.

One of the gems in this collection, and there are many, is Rosalind Hursthouse's relation of virtue ethics to the treatment of animals. Besides containing a very good, short introduction to virtue ethics, the article shows that much nuance is appropriate to the proper treatment of animals. She argues cogently for pluralism of values and perspectives against those who try to meet all moral contingencies with a single or a small number of principles.

Tzachi Zamir, in another gem, does the same thing for the literary approach to animal ethics that Hursthouse does for the virtue ethics approach. This is the most compelling and interesting advocacy of the literary approach that I have ever encountered. Literature affects our perceptions, and one of the bases of all moral action is perception of the situation at hand. Zamir illustrates this thesis and shows its importance with a series of interesting examples.

One section of The Oxford Handbook of Animal Ethics contains four articles devoted to the relationship of person theory to the moral status of animals. Sarah Chan and John Harris employ evidence and concepts from the field of cognitive ethology to argue that some animals, "in particular great apes and cetaceans," are sufficiently self-aware to deserve the right to life (322-23). We should respect such rights to life regardless of attendant inconvenience, such as to the tuna industry which regularly kills some dolphins as by-catch (324).

My favorite of the four articles in this section, however, is the long, detailed, and analytically tight article by Michael Tooley on the personhood of animals. He gives cogent reasons to reject contractarian approaches which deny moral standing to animals (349-50), and then, using concepts drawn from work in the philosophy of mind, casts serious doubt on Tom Regan's animal rights position (360-65).

Some articles consider bio-technological developments which currently and increasingly in the future call the human-animal distinction into question. Chan and Harris conclude their article on personhood with a discussion of the possibility of enhancing animal abilities to such an extent that many more animals may become persons. They seem to embrace this brave new world while recognizing that it will challenge our concepts of personhood.

Julian Savulescu defends the practice of creating genetically modified animals (GMAs), whether by "transferring genes from one species to another" (creating transgenic animals), "mixing the sperm of one species with the ovum of another" (creating hybrid animals), or "mixing cells from the embryo of one animal with those of a different species" (creating chimeras) (641). Chimeras of the quail-duck variety have been produced already in attempts to study embryonic development. Savulescu sees value in recently created mice with functional human brain cells as models for certain human diseases. A yet-to-be-created human-chimp chimera may be used to study the development of human language (648-49). "The final chapter in human evolution might be to rationally design life itself and keep all life on earth under such control" (660). Savulescu discusses needed safeguards and current uncertainties about moral status, but in the end endorses such practices in general by replying to four major criticisms.

Henry T. Greely also defends the production of human/nonhuman chimeras. The SCID-hu-mouse, for example, has a human rather than a mouse immune system, making it helpful in AIDS research (671). Greely argues that we don't really have to worry about such morally problematic cases as chimpanzees with human brains because there isn't enough room for a human brain in a chimp's cranium (683).

The articles by Savulescu and Greely are fascinating but, I think, troubling. Although they reply to objections from social conservative critics of the practices that they (with some qualifications) endorse, there is no substitute for having social conservatives speak for themselves. I find the articles in this volume insufficiently skeptical of the ability of human beings to react beneficently under conditions of unprecedented power and moral uncertainty. A rejoinder from a social conservative would be a welcome addition to the volume.

Of the several valuable articles on practical ethics, I found Hugh LaFollette's discussion of animal experimentation in biomedical research to be particularly helpful. His measured account does not claim that all experimentation on animals is immoral or unhelpful, but he uses historical evidence and sound reasoning to question the morality and utility of the vast majority of such experimentation. Some of the objections to curtailing experimentation that he entertains and some of the replies that he offers were new to me, and I have worked in this field. Missing, however, are two considerations regarding the use of animals in tests of medications designed for use by human beings. First, it is sometimes objected to curtailing experiments on animals that the only alternative is experimentation on human beings. One reply is that although many animals are used to assess the safety of medications for human beings, we end up experimenting on human beings anyway. Differences between people and animals (which LaFollette emphasizes) are such that safety of a drug for animals is no guarantee of safety for human beings. Implicit recognition of this fact is the use of only several human beings in Phase I clinical trials of new medications. These few human beings are at jeopardy whether or not animal studies preceded their use of the drug in question.

The common reply by advocates of animal experimentation is that animal studies reduce the jeopardy to human beings of drug trials because drugs found toxic to animals are not given to human beings. However, this just raises the second consideration. Given the differences between people and animals, it is possible that many drugs that are toxic to experimental animals would be safe and effective for human beings. The practice of animal trials may be depriving people of the enormous medical help that could come from medications which are toxic to experimental animals. In short, only experiments on people can determine what medications are helpful and harmful to human beings.

The other articles in the practical ethics section are also worth serious attention. Clare Palmer, for example, bases duties to domesticated (as opposed to wild) animals on historically created relationships between people and those animals. Although their sentience is a necessary condition for duties to animals, it is not sufficient to account for many such duties. We generally have more duties to domesticated than to wild animals because domesticated animals are those which we have purposely made vulnerable and dependent on us. But we may also have special duties to some wild animals, especially to those whose lives we have disrupted through habitat destruction. Readers may be pleased to find that Palmer shows the principles she develops do not require any special solicitude toward urban (wild or feral) rats.

Elizabeth Harman makes a strong case that painlessly killing what she calls "animals of intermediate mental sophistication, including dogs, cats, cows, and pigs" (726) is morally wrong except where there are overriding moral considerations. Although she does not discuss the issue, this article has implications for eating the meat of humanely-raised livestock which are killed painlessly.

Stuart Rachels does address the issue of vegetarianism, providing vivid descriptions of the horrors of factory farming. He goes on to give an excellent overall moral defense of vegetarianism. Gary Varner, by contrast, finds a place for hunting -- not so much sport hunting as what he calls therapeutic and subsistence hunting -- among thinkers who care about both environmental health and animal welfare. He engages such major thinkers in these fields as J. Baird Callicott and Tom Regan but, it seems to me, fails to give sufficient consideration to the possibility of introducing wild predators to preserve ecosystems from the ravages of overpopulated deer and other herbivores.

David DeGrazia's article on zoos and Hilary Bok's article on pets are among the gems in this volume. In sum, this anthology makes a substantial contribution to scholarship on animal ethics. I recommend it highly.