The Oxford Handbook of Aristotle

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Christopher Shields (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Aristotle, Oxford University Press, 2012, 744pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195187489.

Reviewed by Lloyd P. Gerson, University of Toronto


Is there a philosopher in the history of philosophy whose achievement even comes close to the breadth and depth of the work of Aristotle? Leibniz is perhaps a very distant second. And this is so despite the fact that we possess considerably less than half of Aristotle's writings. For this reason alone, the task of producing a 'handbook' of Aristotle presents a considerable challenge. The editor, Christopher Shields, has largely met the challenge with a collection of twenty-six substantial articles, ranging from those that would serve as introductions to particular subjects for advanced undergraduates to those that would fit fairly comfortably in collections of essays intended primarily for scholars and specialists. Like the volume which is a sort of companion, The Oxford Handbook of Plato (ed. Gail Fine, 2011), advertised as 'suitable for scholars and advanced students', the present work presents the material at a fairly high level, though there is a notable clarity and conciseness throughout. Here is the table of contents:

Part I Aristotle's Philosophical Milieu: 1. 'Aristotle's Philosophical Life and Writings', Christopher Shields; 2. 'Aristotle on Earlier Natural Science', Edward Hussey; 3. 'Science and Scientific Inquiry in Aristotle: A Platonic Provenance', Robert Bolton. Part II The Framework of Philosophy: Tools and Methods: 4. 'Aristotle's Categorial Scheme', Paul Studtmann; 5. 'De Interpretatione', Hermann Weidemann; 6. 'Aristotle's Logic', Paolo Crivelli; 7. 'Aristotle's Philosophical Method', C.D.C. Reeve; 8. 'Aristotle on Heuristic Inquiry and Demonstration of What It Is', Kei Chiba. Part III Explanation and Nature: 9. 'Alteration and Persistence: Form and Matter in the Physics and De Generatione et Corruptione', S. Marc Cohen; 10. 'Teleological Causation', David Charles; 11. 'Aristotle on the Infinite', Ursula Coope; 12. 'The Complexity of Aristotle's Study of Animals', James G. Lennox; 13. 'Aristotle on the Separability of Mind', Fred D. Miller, Jr. Part IV Being and Beings: 14. 'Being qua Being', Christopher Shields; 15. 'Substance, Coincidentals, and Aristotle's Constituent Ontology', Michael J. Loux; 16. 'Enegeia and Dunamis', Stephen Makin; 17. 'Aristotle's Theology', Stephen Menn; 18. 'Aristotle's Philosophy of Mathematics', David Bostock. Part V Ethics and Politics: 19. 'Conceptions of Happiness in the Nicomachean Ethics', T.H. Irwin; 20. 'Aristotle on Becoming Good: Habituation, Reflection, and Perception', Richard Kraut; 21. 'Aristotle's Politics', Pierre Pellegrin. Part VI Rhetoric and the Arts: 22. 'Aristotle on the Moral Psychology of Persuasion', Christof Rapp; 23. 'Aristotle on Poetry', Annamaria Schiaparelli and Paolo Crivelli. Part VII After Aristotle: 24. 'Meaning: Ancient Comments on Five Lines of Aristotle', Richard Sorabji; 25. 'Aristotle in the Arabic Commentary Tradition', Peter Adamson; 26. 'The Latin Aristotle', Robert Pasnau.

The unifying theme of Aristotle's philosophical writings is that of scientific knowledge (epistēmē). Virtually all of the 3,000 or so pages of the corpus focus on various aspects of either theoretical or practical or productive science: the first including the study of everything that exists in nature, mathematics, and theological or divine entities, if there be such; the second, including all that pertains to human action (praxis), whether individual or familial or group; the third, aimed in general at the products of human actions, especially, in the material we possess, artistic products. The important supplement to these substantive sciences is comprised of the short treatises known as the Organon, the collection of intellectual 'tools' of scientific reasoning and demonstration. A major task for anyone attempting to mediate between Aristotle and an audience consisting of people who are not specialists is, I think, to convey the vitality of Aristotle's scientific thinking while at the same acknowledging the obvious deficiencies of his science. Aristotle knew nothing about Newtonian mechanics, much less quantum mechanics, nothing about molecular biology or genetics, nothing about neuroscience, and so on. His knowledge of mathematics was apparently fairly basic and he had hardly a clue about economic science, although he did grasp the core idea of money. A reader more or less new to the thought of Aristotle should hope to come away from this book thinking, at least, that Dante's awe-inspired reference to Aristotle as il maestro di color che sanno need not now be understood ironically. How is this to be done?

Modern science and its methodology is, for the most part, associated with a thoroughly naturalistic framework. It is not Aristotle's deficiencies with respect to science thus situated that need to be emphasized, but rather his complete opposition to naturalism, despite the almost mythical status of his empirical investigations, especially in biology. I would suggest that if it is indeed the case that Aristotle has nothing to teach us, this would be because naturalism is true, and that there is no such thing as philosophical knowledge that is not absorbed or apt to be absorbed within empirical science. This was the position of Richard Rorty, among many others. On the other hand, if naturalism is false or at least in part false, especially with respect to its accounts of action, cognition, and human excellence, then Aristotle's contributions in these areas may well remain undisturbed. Aristotle thought that the brain was something like a cooling mechanism for the heat generated in the body. In this he took a step back from Plato. But does that absolutely negate his accounts of human belief, volition, and desire? The challenge of anyone writing on Aristotle for non-specialists would be to show that the answer to this question is no.

Perhaps inevitably, there are, however, some gaps in the areas covered, notably in the treatment of Aristotle's philosophy of nature. In the corpus of Aristotle's extant works, this material -- covering everything from astronomy to zoology, literally everything that moves or changes in any way -- extends to more than one half of the total. And yet, we have only one piece on Aristotle's philosophy of biology, that of Lennox, and one on his psychology, that of Miller, which deals only with a specific and arguably detachable part of that psychology, the question of the separability of intellect. So, we do not have anything like a comprehensive exposition of Aristotle's principles of biology or psychology. This absence of context might stymie the neophyte. For that matter, though the sections on Aristotle's metaphysics and ethics contain some of the best pieces in the book, nowhere is there a comprehensive account of the unity of that apparently disunified work Metaphysics nor of the principles of practical science, under which ethics and politics fall. There is nothing at all devoted exclusively to the fascinating and complex argumentation in Aristotle's works On the Heavens and Meteorology. Nor is there anything on the Mechanics or Problems, both rich in scientific and applied mathematical speculation, although these works, in whole or in part, may well be of 'the school of Aristotle' rather than by Aristotle himself. Finally, although Aristotle's criticism of Plato and the Academy is mentioned in a number of places, this important topic is not given separate treatment. Having noted these lacunae, I nevertheless want to emphasize how good this book is, providing an (almost) complete state-of-the-art record of contemporary Aristotle scholarship.

It is of course not possible in the space of a short review to discuss or even to say anything useful about all of the essays in this book. They are uniformly of a high quality. For the most part the authors, quite properly for such a project, steer clear of controversy. I shall limit myself to some brief remarks about those essays whose perspectives and conclusions I found particularly thought-provoking.

Chiba's 'Aristotle on Heuristic Inquiry and Demonstration of What it is', begins with an arresting claim: Aristotle's theory of demonstration is developed 'as a way of gaining causal knowledge of things or events' (171). The standard account of the demonstrative syllogism is that it is 'non-ampliative', that is, that the conclusion does not contain more than what is in the premises. This property sets it apart from inductive arguments, which then inevitably must be probabilistic. If the scientific syllogism is to be constitutive of a heuristic inquiry, it will have to be at the same time certain, that is, demonstrative, and somehow advance knowledge. Chiba's account of how this can be so is to argue that '[a] successful demonstration reflects the explanatory structure embedded in the world, whose discovery is the object of heuristic demonstrative inquiry' (177). This inquiry 'aims at grasping a demonstration', that is, at seeing the explanatory connection between a definition of the essence of a substance and a property that the substances possesses. Chiba argues that the heuristic pursuit of essence ('what it was for S to be S') is Aristotle's version of the 'Socratic' 'what is x?' question (185). Chiba concludes that Aristotle 'establishes the necessity of having a demonstration if one is to grasp the essence of a thing whose cause is distinct, even though there is no demonstration of its essence' (196). As Chiba perceptively notes, Aristotle does not think that one knows (achieves knowledge) 'from' the premises of a syllogism, but one knows 'through' demonstration, where the 'through' indicates a kind of intellectual seeing of the necessary connectedness or unity of an essence and a property.

David Charles in 'Teleological Causation' has a beautifully clear account of one rather notorious focus of Aristotle's anti-naturalism, namely his doctrine of teleology or final causality. Charles worries, unnecessarily I think, about how a goal or a good can be a cause. The simple answer is that the Greek word aitia, translated here as 'cause', has a connotation broader than 'cause' in technical English. 'Explanation' would be a better translation. But one relying on a naturalistic principle of causal closure would want to insist that in fact 'explanation' does not transcend causality. So, the task for Aristotle and for his expositors is to show that, counter to the naturalist, explanation -- scientific explanation -- must go beyond what Aristotle would designate as 'efficient' causality. It will not help Aristotle to insist, as he does, that explanations in, say, mathematics go beyond the limits of causal closure, since the naturalist will reply that mathematical proofs are explanatory in only an attenuated sense of that term. Charles properly focuses on constructing a precise definition of teleological causality: (A) the cause is a goal which it is good for the agent to bring about and (B) what is caused is the coming to be of certain features in ways which are good or useful ways to achieve the goal in question (232).

The core of the paper is Charles's argument against one interpretation of teleological causality, that which reduces it to a distinctive sort of efficient causality, namely efficient causality that is goal-directed (235ff). Charles makes what I take to be the decisive criticism of this interpretation, namely, that goal-directed causality presupposes goals. This irreducibility of final causality is one crucial battlefield of the naturalism/anti-naturalism debate. As Aristotle repeatedly maintains, animals have the properties and organization of elements that they do because it is good for them (that is, it serves their goal) to have them, not the other way around. This leads Aristotle to conclude that there is, for example, real explanatory force in the answer to the question of why human beings have intellects, even if it is true that there is an efficient causal explanation (e.g., natural selection) as well. Charles carefully lists and excludes some putative causes of teleological explanation, including inter-specific teleology ('prey exist for the good of predators'), rainfall in order to nourish the crops, and reproduction as directed to the goal of immortality. In the last mentioned case, however, Charles, in my view, unpersuasively works to separate Aristotle from the teleology of reproduction by claiming that he only wishes to use teleological and theological language to make what actually occurs seem intelligible (248). But surely if it is intelligible, for Aristotle that is because it is true. Charles's rejection of the teleology of reproduction leads him to a sort of deflationary interpretation of the famous end of Aristotle's Metaphysics in which he seems to endorse a global teleology, where all nature works together for one goal. Charles's main argument here is that 'nature' does not refer to one cosmic nature, but rather to the natures of species, understood distributively, as it were (252). Charles rightly insists that a defender of an Aristotelian cosmic teleology has the burden of showing that the precise definition of final causality does not require the reduction of the 'cosmic' to the specific (or even the individual?), exactly in the way that the naturalist would claim that final causality is reduced to efficient causality.

Coope's relatively brief paper, 'Aristotle on the Infinite' offers a new and, in my view, persuasive account of the following dilemma in Aristotle's doctrine of infinity: Aristotle holds that an 'actual' infinity is impossible, for example, the number of stars in the heavens must be finite, and there cannot be an actual infinite number of points on a line. Instead, a magnitude can increase or divide indefinitely. All putative actual infinities, as in modern mathematics, can be mapped onto potentially infinite aggregates, analogous to the way in which Poincaré showed that the theorems of non-Euclidean geometry could be mapped onto the Euclidean theorems regarding conic sections. And yet Aristotle repeatedly explains potentialities as functionally dependent on actualities. Thus, it would seem that there cannot be a potential infinity, if it is not even possible that there be an actual infinity. Coope's neat solution is: 'being divided here stands to the potential for being divided anywhere as jumping three feet stands to the potential to jump four feet' (270). As Coope goes on to explain, the crucial difference is between a process and an activity (281). The (potentially) infinite division of a magnitude is a process that is at the time of division being fulfilled as completely as possible, that is, its ongoing division is actually occurring, although the actual infinite division is impossible. This is why, as Coope notes, Aristotle says that the infinite has its being in becoming. It is perhaps worth adding that this solution helps support the Aristotelian claim that transfinite arithmetic does not in itself invalidate Aristotle's account of the ontological basis for all mathematics, namely, finite nature.

'Being qua Being', by the volume's editor, raises the well-known problem of how Aristotle's strictures on the nature of science -- especially that the object of science have a specific or generic unity -- allow the possibility of a science of being qua being. Since being is not a genus, what is the supposed subject matter of this science? Shields is critical of one traditional answer to this problem, that is, the invocation of the Aristotelian notion of 'core-dependent homonymy' or, what is sometimes called 'focal meaning', where 'being' has primary and derivative referents. For on this interpretation, Aristotle hypothesizes that the study of the primary referent of 'being' will include all secondary and tertiary references of being within it, owing to their causal dependence on the primary. So, a science of being qua being is, after all, possible. The task for this science is to locate the primary referent of 'being' and to show how being is derived to all the other referents. Aristotle postulates as the focus of the science ousia or substance.

The problem with this view, as Shields well articulates, is that, though it is plausible to argue that the accidents of sensible substances are dependent on and so explicable through these substances, the sensible substances themselves cannot be the primary referents. Rather, for Aristotle the primary referent(s) or primary ousiai seem to be immaterial beings or the sole primary being, the unmoved mover. In line with most interpreters, Shields finds nowhere in Aristotle an answer to the question of how the being of, say, a rock, is scientifically grasped by studying the being of the 'thinking thinking of thinking' that is the unmoved mover.

Shields, in my view, misreads the crucial passage at Met. 1026a23-32, where Aristotle says that if there is no other substance apart from those constituted by nature, then physics would be first philosophy. But if there is such a substance, then the study of it would investigate being qua being. So, Aristotle, rightly or wrongly, appears to identify the science with theology, and to be wedded to trying to show that the being of the first is the source of all the rest. But Shields thinks Aristotle can be interpreted as holding that the science of being qua being is detachable from theology, focusing on the per se features of beings, especially their logical, categorical, and modal properties (359). But I think Shields confuses Aristotle's commitment to an hypothesis with what is perhaps its falsity. Aristotle does not mean that if the unmoved mover did not exist, then there could be a science of the being of the only beings that exist, sensible being He clearly means that if the unmoved mover did not (per impossibile) exist, then physics, the science of the movable qua movable, would be first philosophy. But since the unmoved mover does necessarily exist, and since it turns out to be, upon analysis, being in its purest form, that being should be causally related to the being of everything else. Of course, we do get a universal causal connection, final causality, but almost no one has found this to be a suitable vehicle for understanding the being of everything, including the being of the past, the future, and even unrealized and perhaps unrealizable possibilities. For Shields, the focus on substance stands, even if there are only sensible substances, because core-dependent homonymy is then plausible, that is, the per se features of being can be universally studied in all such beings. In agreeing with Aristotle that the focus of the science of being qua being is substance, but denying that this science is, for Aristotle identical with theology, Shields may, after all, be improving on Aristotle, even if he is misinterpreting him.

Pellegrin's paper, 'Aristotle's Politics' is a splendid fresh look at the underlying principles of what is, for Aristotle, the 'architectonic' practical science. As Pellegrin shows, Aristotle's conception of politics is rooted in his epistemology and, we should add, his hylomorphic account of nature, since the polis exists by nature. Pellegrin is certainly correct that the facile contrast of Aristotle and Plato in political philosophy between the realist and the utopian, should be replaced with the difference between how both viewed the possibility of the autonomy of 'political science' (558-9). For Plato, according to Pellegrin, there is no real political science; it is dialectic that encompasses all intellectual enterprise.

Contrary to this claim, though, I would suggest that this is truer of Republic than it is of Statesman, where Plato seems to abandon the identification of the dialectician with the statesman. For Pellegrin, the autonomy of political science is just the autonomy of practical reasoning, as embodied in the wise legislator. Its independence, then, from theoretical science does not, however, turn politics into mere realpolitik, though there is much of that, too, in Politics. Presumably, the key to the possibility of a political science is the non-empirical claim that the polis exists by nature. This is not, for Aristotle, a metaphor. The naturalness of the polis, hence, explains the fact that it can have a good or final cause independent of that of its constituent members, individual human beings. This inevitably means that the individual is in a substantial way dependent on the polis, a position that Pellegrin claims is 'the farthest point Aristotle ever reached in adopting such a Platonic position' (564).

Pellegrin does not develop this point, but perhaps Aristotle's own unease with this conclusion is reflected in his claim, in Nicomachean Ethics, a claim repeated several times, namely, that we are not really or ultimately human beings but rather intellects, and our highest good is found in theoretical activity, not in participating in the polis. Pellegrin reveals this tension when he argues that, for Aristotle, slaves, though they are not needed economically, are needed politically (569). This is so because without slaves to carry out necessary domestic tasks, people could not function as citizens; neither could they be free of participation in the economic sphere. 'Citizenship' here seems to mean administrative or legislative activity, but also, evidently, philosophy, as Aristotle says. But when people do philosophy, do they need to be citizens, at least in Aristotle's robust sense of that term? Pellegrin has numerous illuminating remarks on constitutions, what he calls 'the main object of Aristotle's Politics' (570). He might have usefully added that the constitution is the 'form' of the entity that is the polis, and the people who are governed by it are the 'matter'. Aristotle's taxonomy of constitutions sets out, as we would expect, both the complete range of theoretical possibilities, and the necessity of adopting one or another of these possibilities to the pre-existing 'matter'. His analysis of constitutional change in book five of Politics, what Pellegrin calls 'the birth certificate of political science' (579), cries out for extensive comparison with Aristotle's History of Animals, and his other discussions of the various ways that animals prosper or fail to achieve their final causes.

There are at least five other papers that I found particularly worthy of engagement: Crivelli's excellent account of the logic of propositions and of syllogisms, Reeve's painstaking analysis of Aristotelian dialectic, Miller's lucid presentation of the issues and various possible interpretations surrounding what Aristotle calls 'the separate intellect', Menn's exegesis of Aristotle's theology (as for Shields, not identified with a science of being qua being), and Bostock's helpful treatment of a topic not often enough addressed, Aristotle's philosophy of mathematics. Both students and specialists would, I think, profit from each of these essays. In addition, the two papers by Adamson and Pasnau on the reception of Aristotle in the Arabic and Latin philosophical traditions are exemplary.

It is something of a paradox that Aristotle's relentlessly systematic approach to almost every problem and topic he takes up never reveals an overall Aristotelian system. Nothing in this work suggests otherwise. Rather, what we find in this handbook are finely articulated accounts of a variegated assault on naturalism. Read thus, even the more esoteric reaches of Aristotle's intellect should hold our interest.