The Oxford Handbook of British Philosophy in the Eighteenth Century

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James A. Harris (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of British Philosophy in the Eighteenth Century, Oxford University Press, 2013, 670pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199549023.

Reviewed by Ryan Patrick Hanley, Marquette University


The publisher's website for the Oxford Handbooks in Philosophy touts the individual installments in its series as providing "everything you need to know" in "one comprehensive, superbly produced, volume." This clearly sets a high bar. Yet this book, edited by James A. Harris, clears this high bar with room to spare, and provides an outstanding survey of the key figures and questions that dominated eighteenth-century British philosophy.

There are 27 newly-commissioned essays organized into seven parts, with Harris's introduction very helpfully setting the stage for what follows. His primary aim in the introduction is to define precisely each of the three substantive components of the volume's title and subject. By "eighteenth century," Harris explains, the volume means to compass the period that commenced with the "new beginnings" launched in the late 1680s, including especially the 1687 publication of Newton's Principia, the Glorious Revolution of 1688, and the 1690 publication of Locke's Essay (2). By "British," Harris explains, the volume's title means to refer to the entire range of philosophical inquiry prosecuted during this period in England, Wales, Ireland and Scotland. This is justified on the wholly legitimate grounds that "the border that mattered, it often seems, was the one that divided Britain from the rest of Europe" (6). This captures the essential and now generally well recognized differences that distinguished the philosophy of eighteenth-century Britain from the issues and methods prevalent in contemporary philosophical inquiry on the other side of the Channel, and challenges long-standing tendencies in scholarship on the history of ideas in the Enlightenment to emphasize the primacy of national context and the uniqueness of the Scottish Enlightenment in particular.

Yet it is Harris's explication of the third term of the volume's title that is likely the most significant. Eighteenth-century Britons, he explains, took the category "philosophy" to encompass much more than what we today customarily regard as properly part of philosophy; for them, "the passions, morals, criticism, and politics mattered just as much as, if not more than, epistemology and metaphysics" (10). As a result, he insists, "gross distortion and simplification would be the result of allowing a book such as this to be dominated by topics in (what we now call) epistemology and metaphysics, and of giving single chapters to the passions, to ethics, to aesthetics, and to political philosophy" (10). This conviction animates the organization as a whole, and to my mind reaps significant dividends.

In the first place, it establishes the book's comparative advantage when evaluated in the context of the crowded field of other excellent surveys of its subject. Readers of this work are likely to be familiar with The Cambridge History of Eighteenth-Century Philosophy, edited by Knud Haakonssen, or The Routledge Companion to Eighteenth-Century Philosophy, edited by Aaron Garrett. All three are distinguished by a high level of scholarship, and will be indispensible to students of their subject. But Harris's volume differs from the other two not just in focusing on British philosophy but also in the space it gives to metaphysics and epistemology as compared to other themes; thus where 15 of the 35 essays in Garrett's volume and 10 of the 36 essays in Haakonssen's focus primarily on themes that might be construed as falling under the headings of metaphysics and epistemology, the 27 essays of this volume include only 4 under the explicit heading of "Logic and Metaphysics," in which the essays on "The Understanding" and "Mind and Matter" are gathered.

Of course, many, if not most, of the essays touch on themes recognizably related to core concerns in metaphysics and epistemology, but the vision of philosophy developed in the introduction and reinforced by the volume's organization largely serves to reinforce the vision of philosophy as a subject "as much practical as theoretical" (7), and indeed one which covered a wide range of genres -- poetry, essays, novels, sermons, reflections -- broadly dedicated to the promotion of "self-cultivation" in the spirit of works such as Shaftesbury's Characteristics (8).

The essays are largely organized along the lines sketched in the introduction. Part I, dedicated to "The Languages of Philosophy in Eighteenth-Century Britain," includes four essays that lay out the key contexts and points of departure. It begins with Timothy Stanton's study of Locke and his ubiquity in eighteenth-century British debate. Stanton helpfully walks readers through the essential claims of Locke's Essay and his political and religious writings, and also examines how these claims were taken up by a range of subsequent thinkers. Eric Schliesser's contribution on Newton does much the same for its subject, surveying the key claims of the Principia and the Opticks, focusing especially on how engagement with Newton served to induce a form of methodological self-reflection that would in time "change the character of philosophical theorizing" (52). The other two essays -- Jacqueline Taylor's on "The Idea of a Science of Human Nature" and Paddy Bullard's on "Rhetoric and Eloquence: The Language of Persuasion" -- likewise take comprehensive views of broad trends, focusing respectively on the ways in which eighteenth-century British thinkers applied the methods of natural philosophy to the study of human nature, and the ways in which the art of eloquence was variously conceived across differing national contexts.

Part II, chiefly on epistemology and metaphysics, begin with Rebecca Copenhaver's "Perception and the Language of Nature" which surveys the ways in which post-Lockean conceptions of sensory perception and associationism were developed by Berkeley and Reid, and Hume and Hartley. Laurent Jaffro's "Language and Thought" goes on to explore epistemic questions, from the origins and significance of language to the nature of abstract general ideas and the relationship of ideas to sensation. In "The Understanding", John Wright provides an admirably precise survey of the way in which key British thinkers from Locke to Hume understood the extent of the mind's natural powers as well as their varying conceptions of the limits of human understanding. The section closes with Aaron Garrett's "Mind and Matter," which focuses on the legacy of dualism and the challenges posed by materialism.

Part III,"The Passions", covers a range of themes including what we today would recognize as falling under the broad headings of moral psychology, virtue ethics, and the free will debate. "Passions, Affectations, Sentiments: Taxonomy and Terminology" by Amy Schmitter provides a welcome and insightful delineation of the ways in which these overlapping categories were separately conceived by eighteenth-century British philosophers -- an effort all the more welcome given the contemporary fascination with "affect" across the social sciences and humanities. Terence Cuneo's "Reason and the Passions" is to welcome for similar reasons insofar as it provides an elegant exposure of the limitations of the all-too-convenient distinction commonly drawn between sentimentalists and rationalists, persuasively demonstrating the degree to which many eighteenth-century British thinkers understood sentiment and reason to work together. Sean Greenberg ("Liberty and Necessity") further aims to shed useful historical light on a familiar contemporary issue, and specifically to recover the centrality of the moral psychological context to the libertarian-necessitarian debate between Clarke, Reid and Price in the one camp, and Hartley and Priestley in the other. The final essay is by the editor, and further develops the claims of his introduction by demonstrating the centrality of concerns with self-cultivation in eighteenth-century British philosophy insofar as "the mainstream view in the eighteenth century was that philosophy had a part to play in the ordering and restraint of the passions as well as in their analysis," and could thus usefully serve as a sort of "medicine for the mind" (271).

This turn to practical philosophy serves to introduce the focus on practical philosophy that dominates the remainder of the volume. Part IV turns to "Morals," beginning with Christian Maurer's excellent contribution. Maurer introduces us to the key debates in eighteenth-century British moral philosophy via the tension between self-directedness and other-directedness that is rightly portrayed as central to the ethical theory of the period. Maurer frames his study as an analysis of the ways in which various later thinkers reacted to the Hobbes/Mandeville synthesis that Hume would later label the "selfish system of morals," and presents the tension largely as one between Epicureans and Stoics (a familiar way of conceiving the issue, though one needing careful handling). The chapters that follow focus on specific topics emerging out of this broader debate. P. J. E. Kail's "Moral Judgment" and Dario Perinetti's "The Nature of Virtue" examine issues at the intersection of moral philosophy with epistemology and metaphysics, Perinetti frames his discussion not merely as a study of how eighteenth-century British philosophers sought to answer the question of "what makes a particular character virtuous" but also as a contribution to the development of a genuine "metaphysics of morals" (333).  This provides an interesting lens through which to revisit important and familiar territory. Colin Heydt's "Practical Ethics, casts light on a somewhat less familiar corner of eighteenth-century British ethics, and provides a compelling account of the broad agreement among eighteenth-century British thinkers with regard to the specific virtues and duties that they sought to defend.

Part V turns to "Criticism." It starts with Paul Guyer's "The Pleasures of the Imagination and the Objects of Taste," which aims to bring to the fore "the wide range of aesthetic categories" beyond beauty that garnered the attention of eighteenth-century British writers and also takes important steps towards defining "the common thread that tied them together" (394). Timothy Costelloe ("The Faculty of Taste") examines the different ways in which taste was conceived, from internal sense to imagination to principles of association. Two especially enjoyable essays show the benefits of the volume's big-tent approach. "The Pleasures of Tragedy" by E.M. Dadlez, examines the interpenetration of the theater and theatricality in eighteenth-century British ethical and social inquiry, focusing on the specific question of "how there can be pleasing imitations of unpleasing things" (465). Peter Kivy's "Genius and the Creative Imagination" is one of the most creative pieces, compellingly and charmingly arguing that it is in fact not to nineteenth-century Germans but to eighteenth-century Britons -- including especially Joseph Addison, Edward Young, Alexander Gerard, and William Duff -- that we owe our modern conception of genius.

Part VI turns to "Politics." Dario Castiglione's "The Origin of Civil Government" eschews the focus characteristic of Scottish thinkers on historical narratives of the evolution of political institutions for a focused and self-consciously "philosophical" analysis of concepts of authority and the system of liberty. It is thus left to Craig Smith's  "Forms of Government" to introduce the ways in which eighteenth-century British political thought treated such themes as the authority of the ancient constitution, the nature of the mixed constitution, the practice of representation, and the nature and limits of executive power. Neil McArthur's "Reform and Revolution" goes on to examine the concept of political legitimacy in thinkers from Locke and Berkeley through Bentham and Burke. Richard Whatmore's excellent "Luxury, Commerce, and the Rise of Political Economy" surveys how the eighteenth-century debate over luxury served to raise not only a number of fundamental moral questions but also important questions about state size, the legitimacy of empire, and the relationship of commerce and trade to concerns of war and peace.

The  final section is "Philosophy and Religion." Paul Russell, focuses on the long shadow cast by Hobbes over eighteenth-century British debates on religion, and perhaps more explicitly than any other single essay aims to introduce a new way of conceiving familiar territory (more on this below). Alexander Broadie's "Philosophy, Revealed Religion, and the Enlightenment" also compels rethinking of certain long-standing assumptions, especially concerning the relative compatibility or incompatibility of revealed religion and Enlightenment. Broadie is particularly concerned to have us reexamine what he describes as "a Whiggish triumphalist narrative about the emergence of secularism" (622) that fails to account for such enlightened theists as Hutcheson, Reid, Campbell and Stewart; better, he argues, to substitute for this narrative a recognition that "the Enlightenment is not, by its nature, hostile to revealed religion, even though many who were enlightened were indeed hostile to it" (636). Thomas Ahnert's exposition of the relationship between religion and morality focuses on the way in which questions of God's existence and His bestowal of punishments and rewards in the afterlife were understood by eighteenth-century British philosophers to bear on moral theory and practice.

All told, the essays constitute a valuable effort to present a manageable survey of a broad and diverse philosophical terrain.  Of course, another editor might have differing thoughts about what thinkers and topics deserve greater emphasis. But taking this book as it is, one finds a defensible attempt to present an overview of its subject. The few faults that I find largely owe to the experience of reading it through cover-to-cover -- an experience, I suspect, that few readers of this or other handbooks are likely to have. This sort of reading however does bring to light some repetition across chapters; the treatments of Mandeville began to seem especially familiar by the end. But to the editor's credit, we are warned that there is "a certain amount of overlap between chapters" (14). Those who read the book cover-to-cover will also notice a range in the levels at which the individual pieces are pitched; some are unabashedly introductory with little reference to the extant secondary literature and largely restrain themselves to offering overviews of the key debates in the primary texts, while others have extensive bibliographies and aim to cut new and original edges in the scholarship. Each perhaps has its place, and in any case this is a relatively minor fault given the strengths of the volume as a whole.

Three particular benefits of the approach taken deserve explicit mention. First, one finds throughout a productive and welcome effort to push beyond certain reductionist categories that have become all-too-familiar parts of our philosophical landscape. In this vein several contributors productively and directly try to overcome a sort of Manichean dualism associated with their topic. Thus Cuneo begins by observing that all too often "The great moral philosophers of early modernity come to us pre-packaged" (226). This is especially the case with rationalism and sentimentalism:"it is natural to be suspicious of categorizations such as these; they tend to lack nuance, blocking from view what particular thinkers who allegedly belong to one or another school actually say" (226). Similarly, Perinetti notes that "it would be very difficult to find a clear-cut distinction" between sentimentalism and intellectualism" and calls for us to attend to authors such as Butler who offer a "via media between intellectualism and sentimentalism" (352).

But this approach is perhaps most explicit and most central in Russell's argument that "the opposition between empiricists and rationalists presents a one-dimensional framework in which the significant contributions to the philosophical debate during this period are supposed to all fall neatly on one side or the other of this (particularly salient) divide" (616). But as he aims to show through his studies of Clarke, Berkeley, and Hume, the truth is that "this simple schema must be rejected" (616). Rather than seek to group the major figures "in ways that are entirely alien to their own primary concerns and self-understandings" (617), Russell aims to "identify them in terms of which they could readily recognize and acknowledge" (618). This means moving away from the groupings of empiricist and rationalist to reconceiving the debate as an opposition of "religious philosophers and speculative atheists" -- an opposition that has been "largely neglected" (617).

A second substantive theme concerns the status of Hume in eighteenth-century British philosophy. Hume quite clearly has cast the longest shadow. But as the contributors repeatedly note, his positions were often anomalous. In this vein Heydt calls attention to "how atypical Hume's arguments often are" when seen in the broader context of eighteenth-century British moral thought (386), and so, too, Harris notes that "Hume was very unusual, perhaps unique, in his vision of philosophy as different and distinct from 'practical morality'" (271). Greenberg notes that Hume stood outside the mainstream debate on freedom and necessity insofar as he "raised a challenge to the contemporary formulation of the question concerning liberty and necessity that remained unanswered in the eighteenth century" (249), and Kail warns against "an over-concentration on certain passages of Hume's works, a focus matched by a failure to situate them in context" (315). This line of argument perhaps reaches its peak in Copenhaver's essay, which ties over-emphasis on Hume to over-emphasis on epistemic questions, explaining that "recent treatments of eighteenth-century British philosophy have put Hume and epistemology at its center," and yet insisting that "in the context of the story of theories of perception, Hume is an anomaly, and epistemology enters the center of the picture only insofar as polemics from the latter half of the century managed to change the subject" (126).

Finally, the volume offers a broad definition of philosophy that will strike many if not all readers as welcome. As noted above, this is a concern that is emphasized up front in the editor's introduction:

What attention to the texture and detail of eighteenth-century British letters suggests is that we need to be wary of unreflectively taking it for granted that philosophy is a timeless, ahistorical category, the same thing in all times and all places. We need to be alert to the dangers of assuming that we can decide that such-and-such a text, or such-and-such an aspect or part of a text, is not philosophical, just because it would not count as such today. We need to take care in considering how the word 'philosophy' is used in different times and places. (9)

It is an injunction enthusiastically taken up by a number of the other contributors. Thus Stanton notes that "'philosophy' in the eighteenth century embraced far more than what many would now consider to be philosophy and that it was not the preserve of a professional class of philosophers" (22). Greenberg emphasizes that "eighteenth-century British philosophers were working in a distinct problem space from that of contemporary philosophers," and that "in order to understand their views, it is essential to try to identify their problems in their own terms" (267). Kail warns against any assumption that "the distinction between moral rationalism and sentimentalism of the period maps neatly onto our distinction between cognitivism and non-cognitivism" (315). But perhaps most eloquent of all is Perinetti, who justifies the turn to eighteenth-century British philosophy on the grounds that all histories of philosophy necessarily "rebel against any attempt to make them subservient to contemporary interests."He places "the significance of the history of British moral philosophy in the Enlightenment" in precisely "this complexity and resistance to systematization" -- indeed "it is precisely because the views of the British moralists were so different from ours that we have so much to learn from them" (365). Such claims present not only compelling justification for the study of eighteenth-century British philosophy -- to which this handbook provides a very welcome introduction -- but also compelling justification for the enterprise of the study of the history of philosophy more broadly.