The Oxford Handbook of British Philosophy in the Nineteenth Century

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W. J. Mander (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of British Philosophy in the Nineteenth Century, Oxford University Press, 2014, 650pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199594474.

Reviewed by Jeremy Dunham, University of Sheffield


This volume is a hugely important contribution to scholarship on nineteenth-century philosophy. When assessing an average 'Oxford Handbook' we would often judge it on how well it orientates the reader to current scholarship on the particular subject. However, for many important aspects of British philosophy in the nineteenth century the scholarship is almost non-existent. As W. J. Mander rightly notes in the introduction, when we hear a reference to nineteenth-century philosophy, we are far more likely to think of 'the great systems of continental thought' than the British tradition. Nonetheless, this volume aims to show that this tradition boasts a remarkably rich and varied range of philosophical resources that will repay careful attention, and that it deserves the level of scholarship that the British traditions of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries are beginning to enjoy. In a review of another recent volume on nineteenth-century philosophy Frederick Beiser argued that 'No period of the philosophical past stands in more need of an original historian than nineteenth-century philosophy. The standard tropes and figures do no justice to its depths, riches, and powers'. One of this present volume's greatest virtues is that it answers Beiser's plea by getting beyond these standard tropes and figures and by offering an impressive number of very original contributions to the history of nineteenth-century philosophy.

Mander's collection does an outstanding job of introducing a wide range of philosophical figures and ideas that will be unknown even to most historians of nineteenth-century philosophy and consequently brings to light much of the period's unknown 'depths, riches, and powers'. The volume also includes excellent contributions on well-known philosophers and orientates the reader to the secondary literature on these figures (e.g. J.S. Mill, Marx, Sidgwick). The result of this combination is that the volume provides a clear and comprehensive picture of how nineteenth-century philosophy was practised and understood during the period. Furthermore, Mander claims in the introduction that by presenting nineteenth-century philosophical ideas that are sometimes clouded in obscure and antiquated language in a clear manner, the essays show both the contemporary relevance of its ideas and concepts and also that its philosophers are often 'addressing the same problems as concern us today' (1). Nevertheless, it seems to me that the Handbook is at its most interesting when it shows the broad and varying conceptions of philosophy that were being promoted during this period and just how wide its intellectual horizons were. Rather than simply showing what answers they had to today's questions, the volume may also show the reader what other questions she could or even should be asking.

The Handbook is divided into six parts: (1) Logic and Scientific Method; (2) Metaphysics; (3) Science and Philosophy; (4) Ethical, Social, and Political Thought; (5) Religious Philosophy; and, (6) The Practice of Philosophy. As Mander states, these classifications come from our contemporary perspective, and we should not expect the work of the philosophers discussed to neatly fit within them. Nonetheless, the individual authors should be commended for their great sensitivity in presenting the aspects of a philosopher or school of philosophy that fits within these categories while concurrently making clear how these aspects fit within a larger philosophical perspective that refuses such strict classifications. The only part that does feel slightly strained is 'Religious Philosophy', which include two chapters (both still excellent) where the main focus does not seem to be on religious philosophy at all (Anthony Kenny's 'John Henry Newman', which primarily focuses on epistemology, and James Vigus's 'The Philosophy of Samuel Taylor Coleridge', which discusses Coleridge's attempt to move beyond Kant to develop his metaphysics). Perhaps the value of this is to remind us that even those disciplines that seem today the furthest removed from religious philosophy were frequently engaged with during this period for religious reasons.

For the remainder, however, the divisions work well and the grouping of the articles helps to present a detailed account of the development of British philosophy that is unparalleled in other texts. Take, for example, Jenny Keefe's chapter on J. F. Ferrier. In a work on British Idealism, Ferrier may be considered as the first of a great metaphysical tradition and in that sense pioneering. Yet in an unsympathetic text on Scottish Common Sense philosophy, he may be read as signalling the tradition's downfall and for being partly responsible for this by derailing it and returning to metaphysics. The placement of the chapter allows one to assess Ferrier's work in the wider nineteenth-century context without it being fed exclusively into either of these narratives. This is just one of many ways that this volume is a whole greater than its parts. Although it can be dipped into to aid research on a particular aspect of British thought, it can very profitably be read cover to cover and enjoyed with relatively little repetition of content.

'Logic and Scientific Method' includes five chapters: James Allard's 'Early Nineteenth-Century Logic'; David Godden's 'Mill's System of Logic'; Steffen Ducheyne's 'Whewell's Philosophy of Science'; Jeremy Gray's 'Some British Logicians'; and Phillip Ferreira's 'Idealist Logic'. This section is perhaps the closest the Handbook gets to a traditional overview text. Gray's chapter is divided into six sections, which survey some of the most important developments in logic during the century, covering De Morgan, Boole, Jevons, Venn, Carroll, and Hugh MacColl. Allard's contribution tells the story of how formal logic in the nineteenth century, after having suffered from 150 years of serious neglect, was revitalized by Richard Whatley's 1826 Elements of Logic. The success of Whatley's text was partly due to a change in attitude to 'liberal education' and the emergence of the understanding that such an education demanded a 'properly trained mind'. His formal logic was important exactly because it would aid this training. Allard's elegantly-written chapter then discusses the debates between William Hamilton and Whatley, and Hamilton and De Morgan, which would stimulate Boole's more profound logical innovations. The scene is set nicely for Godden's article on Mill's logic and how Mill developed his empirically grounded thought on this topic in response to Whatley. Godden presents a clear and readable account of Mill's attempts to develop a logic based on the understanding that we must always begin with experienced particulars. Mill's inductivism is regularly referred to throughout this volume, and this chapter does an excellent job of providing the reader with part of the essential context for many nineteenth-century philosophical debates.

The most original scholarly contributions in this part are Ducheyne's chapter on William Whewell and Ferreira's contribution on Idealist Logic. Both show how the British debates were augmented by the importation of philosophical ideas from Germany. Ducheyne discusses Whewell's conception of the methodology of the philosophy of science and the debate within Whewell scholarship about the extent of Kant's influence. Ducheyne presents a balanced assessment and shows that while Kant's philosophy did play a crucial role in the development of Whewell's thought, he believed Kant had failed to show how 'a priori principles' and 'physics with empirical content' could be bridged. He thought his own crucial achievement was to complete this bridging. In addition to this discussion, Ducheyne demonstrates the broad range of Whewell's interests by covering his views on hypotheses, confirmation, and tidology.

Appropriately, the section ends with a chapter on a much-ignored aspect of nineteenth-century philosophy: British Idealist Logic. In any attempt to provide a general conception of an entire school's thought, there is a danger it may ignore important differences among its members. Ferreira does a good job of preventing this by focusing on Green, Bradley, and Bosanquet, and by clearly identifying what is common to all three while also emphasising their own developments. He begins by showing why Green rejected both the theory of 'general ideas', since they remove us from reality by eradicating the individuality of our ideas, and the Millian theory of presented 'atomic' ideas, since this ignores the essential role of the activity of the mind in the production of a particular mental 'this' or 'that'. This leads to the theory of the 'concrete universal', which posits that the content of experience has both particular and universal functions. From this, he goes on to discuss in more depth the theory of judgment (and its relation to the metaphysics of the absolute) in the work of Bradley and Bosanquet, and how the development of their theory of inference responds to the faults of both associationism and the traditional syllogism. As Ferreira himself states, the definitive history of British idealist logic is yet to be written, but his achievement is to have convincingly shown that there would be much to gain from it being so.

The four chapters in 'Metaphysics' are amongst the collection's best: 'Hamilton, Scottish Common Sense, and the Philosophy of the Conditioned' by Gordon Graham; 'J.F. Ferrier's Institutes of Metaphysic' by Jenny Keefe; 'The Philosophy of Shadworth Hodgson' by the volume's editor; and, 'Bradley's Metaphysics' by Pierfrancesco Basile. They build on the contributions from the first section to provide an account of how British thought moved on from the empiricist inductivism of Mill and the Common Sense philosophy of Reid's school to the profound metaphysical systems of the Idealist school. I am unaware of any other volume that presents this historical narrative in such an impressive and detailed way, and it provides many often missed links in the chain. However, the absence of a chapter dedicated to Green's role does seem a shame. This is compounded when we remember that one of the volume's main aims is to show that nineteenth-century British thought deserves more detailed scholarly attention. Excellent scholarly works on Green's thought have recently been published, and important debates are starting to emerge. A chapter dedicated to these discussions would have been a major asset. This relatively minor quibble aside, another insight gained from the section as a whole, as Mander notes, is that the contemporary assessment of Mill's victory in the Hamilton-Mill debate is not reflected in the debate's immediate reception and the 'return to metaphysics' that followed. Graham's article presents a clear overview of both Hamilton's philosophy of the conditioned and the Hamilton-Mill debate. One of the chapter's merits is that it shows that Mill and Hamilton were engaged in very different conceptions of philosophy, and that assessing the debate to some extent depends on examining their relative virtues. It reminds us that there was no agreed conception of the particular intellectual ambitions of philosophy and of the importance of evaluating our own understanding of its ambitions.

Although mentored by Hamilton, Ferrier took Scottish philosophy far closer to the metaphysics of the absolute than Hamilton would have deemed acceptable. Keefe masterly shows that despite the different assessments of this move ('godfather of British idealism' vs. 'traitor to the Scottish Common Sense philosophy'), he presents an impressive systematic philosophy. She admirably illustrates how his work is an 'eclectic combination' of aspects of both the Scottish and German schools and the importance of Ferrier in the move from the dominance of one tradition to the other. She presents a well-balanced assessment of his philosophical contributions and points to areas of interest (such as his theory of ignorance) that deserve the reader's attention even if a discussion of them is beyond the remit of the chapter. If the volume is to succeed in convincing the reader that the nineteenth century's British tradition deserves the attention given to other periods, it must encourage her to turn to the primary sources. Keefe's chapter should do exactly that.

Mander's article on Shadworth Hodgson is impressive for the same reason. He justifies the chapter by stating that although philosophical canons 'self-reinforce their own narrowness' it is worth remembering how much rich and influential work lies 'just outside their bounds' (173). Hodgson's work does not fit neatly within any of the standard categories used to identify philosophers of the nineteenth century, but his original work on 'pure experience' and 'time perception' greatly influenced philosophers as important as William James and Husserl. Beyond Mander's own justification, Hodgson is a name that James scholars will know well, even though they will probably be unfamiliar with the details of his complex system. Mander has done this community a great service by providing such a clear overview of his thought. Furthermore, his hints towards the connection show that there is much to be written on James and Hodgson's relationship and its importance for the former's development of the theory of pure experience and his radical empiricism.

Bradley's name is probably the most familiar of the four covered in this section, and Basile's contribution on his metaphysics is one of the volume's best chapters. Both Bradley scholars and those unfamiliar with his work will benefit from this piece since not only does Basile provide a clear overview of his thought, he also makes an important contribution to Bradley scholarship by discussing his complex relationship with German philosophy. Basile argues that Bradley develops a 'non-Hegelian' form of idealism, but does not suggest he is free from German influence. Bradley's reaction against the German philosopher Johann Friedrich Herbart was crucial for the development of his metaphysics. While the view that the British Idealists were merely a group of 'neo-Hegelians' has been shown to be historically inaccurate, the importance of German philosophy for the development of British Idealism was still clearly great. However, to properly understand the importation of German thought onto British soil during this period, we need to understand the philosophies of not just Kant and Hegel, but also Herbart, Lotze, and Trendelenburg. Helpfully, there are hints of a more sophisticated understanding of this German-British dialogue throughout the volume (e.g., Ralph Waller on James Martineau). In addition, Basile's rich chapter includes a clear discussion of Moore and Russell's grave misunderstandings of Bradley's metaphysics, as well as the problems that Darwinism presents for Bradley's theory of the Absolute. Basile's assessment of Bradley's failure to deal with Darwinism is, we shall see, also relevant for the volume's third part that immediately follows his chapter: 'Science and Philosophy'.

Five of the six chapters in the third part principally deal with the impact of evolutionary theory: John Hedley Brooke's 'Evolution and Religion'; Michael Ruse's 'Evolution and Ethics in Victorian Britain'; John Offer's 'Herbert Spencer'; Mark Francis's 'The Evolutionary Turn in Positivism'; and David Boucher's 'British Idealism and Evolution'. The sixth, by Gary Hatfield, however, is dedicated to 'The Emergence of Psychology'. The key insight gained from reading the first five articles together is how many different conceptions of 'evolution' were in currency throughout the century. It was used in a Darwinian sense for sure, but also in Lamarckian and Spencerian ways, and even in a sense that mirrors its etymological meaning of 'unfolding', which has a closer affinity with preformation than Darwinism.

The section starts with Brooke's rich and readable intellectual history of Darwinism's cultural impact, the problems that it presented for theology, and the various criticisms levelled at the position (e.g., Bishop Wilberforce's) as well as the attempts at appropriation (e.g., Asa Gray's). Ruse's piece continues this story by showing that Darwinism, like Christianity, was a story of origins, and therefore could offer, in some ways, an alternative to it. As a replacement it requires an ethics, and Ruse focuses on the different kind of ethics that emerged from the new understandings of evolution presented by Spencer and Darwin. His discussion of how seriously Darwin took ethics is particularly interesting. By focusing on the relationship between ethics and the life sciences, Ruse contributes one of the best examples in the volume of how historical scholarship on nineteenth-century philosophical debates can inform and influence our contemporary thinking, and of how questions dealt with during the period have arisen again at the forefront of philosophical discussion.

Spencer's work is dealt with in more depth in Offer's dense and comprehensive piece. As well as presenting a detailed exposition of his philosophical system as a whole, he identifies its often-underestimated merits as well as its defects and lacunae, and orientates the reader to contemporary debates surrounding Spencer's work. For Offer, Spencer deserves reappraisal for his pioneering interdisciplinarity and his attempt to account for ethical and sociological theorisation through a biological grounding. Because of the wide promulgation of what Offer sees as misguided characterisations of Spencer's thought, he fights an uphill battle, but the argument gains strength from following Ruse's piece. As Ruse suggests, analytic philosophy has historically been wary of its relationship with biology (he guesses due to its appropriation by the pragmatists and Russell's distaste for the latter), but now that this wariness has largely faded, a detailed reassessment of historical thinkers who have been committed to understanding this relationship would be of great profit.

Francis's and Boucher's chapters both show how an important school of nineteenth-century thought attempted to deal with the 'evolutionary turn'. Francis discusses G. H. Lewes's and Leslie Stephen's attempts to incorporate biology into positivism, but he is careful to be clear that the kind of biology being introduced is frequently not Darwinian evolution, and that this 'naturalisation' of positivism comes from a diverse range of sources. Boucher presents the controversial argument that the British Idealists were not unsympathetic to evolution. However, unlike Francis, Boucher is not sensitive enough to the different conceptions of evolution being used at the time, and this means that his argument seems at times to trade on equivocation. The general thrust of the chapter seems to show that they believed Hegel was a better evolutionist than Darwin. Nonetheless, as Basile argued in his critical exposition of Bradley, the kind of evolution that sees the universe as 'unfolding' or 'homeward bound' is very different to the Darwinian concept of the hierarchy of beings as 'a precarious achievement of natural history' (206). It is indeed a 'reactionary' conception, not a sympathetic one. The interesting question is to what extent were the idealists influenced by a properly Darwinian understanding of evolution not a pre-Darwinian one. The problem is, I think, exacerbated by the treatment of the British idealists as having a single consistent view on the matter. Boucher certainly is right to argue that there were British idealists that were sympathetic to Darwinism, but unfortunately in this chapter it is not easy to disentangle their views from those that understood 'evolution' in a very different way.

The section ends by moving from evolution to psychology. Hatfield's outstanding contribution argues against the received views of the beginnings of psychology as a discipline that have been presented from both the standpoints of the history of philosophy and the history of psychology. He shows that the emergence of 'experimental' philosophy involved both continuity and change and has roots in the history of empirical psychology, going all the way back to Aristotle's De Anima. Hatfield focuses on the nineteenth century British psychological activities that took place in a variety of different institutional and disciplinary contexts and how psychology benefited from the range of different methods and approaches to it. Accordingly, Hatfield argues, this variety was a sign of an enviably healthy intellectual landscape in which psychology flourished.

The volume's fourth part is its largest and broadest. Its seven chapters work well together and present an illuminating picture of the diverse approaches to ethical, social, and political thought in the nineteenth century and the ways that these three branches relate and overlap with each other. The chapters are: Philip Schofield's 'Jeremy Bentham and James Mill'; Dale E. Miller's 'John Stuart Mill's Moral, Social, and Political Philosophy'; Barbara Caine's 'British Feminist Thought'; David Leopold's 'Karl Marx and British Socialism'; Andrew Vincent's 'The Ethics of British Idealism'; Avital Simhony's 'The Political Thought of the British Idealists' by; and Bart Schultz's 'Henry Sidgwick and the Irrationality of the Universe'. The section begins with Schofield's discussion of Bentham and James Mill's empirically-based theory of morality and how this formed the basis for their accounts both of the ideal aims of government and of how we should best encourage governments to work towards these aims and prevent them from abusing their power and promoting their own interests at the expense of the community as a whole. This chapter nicely presents the historical background for Miller's impressive scholarly piece on J. S. Mill. Mill has received much more scholarly attention than most of the other philosophers discussed in this volume, and Miller does an excellent job of presenting the current debates while arguing for his own specific, controversial, charitable, and convincing account of Mill as a sophisticated kind of ideal-code rule utilitarian.

Although she is clear that there is 'no readily identifiable body of nineteenth-century feminist thought' (384), Caine's contribution presents a fascinating account of the diverse range of feminist views and forms of writing developed throughout the nineteenth century. Caine discusses the importance of fiction, socialist ideas and Robert Owen's conception of social organization based on cooperation for the emerging feminist movement, and also how the importance of the particularity of womanly qualities was emphasised in a way that would be criticised by twentieth-century feminists. Importantly, the reception of Wollstonecraft and the way she was rejected by the mid-Victorian era feminists due to her 'scandalous life', but reappropriated at the end of the century thanks to the emergence of the 'new women' movement, guides the very interesting and complicated narrative of the development of different strands of feminist thought. Owen is also discussed in Leopold's contribution on Marx in which Leopold argues that Marx was much more engaged with and had a greater impact on British political life during the nineteenth century than has been appreciated. Most of the discussion is dedicated to Owen's influence on Marx, and Leopold makes a convincing case; however, there is little about the specific character of Marx's own philosophical ideas.

The two chapters on British Idealism by Vincent and Simhony, on its ethical and political thought respectively, work very well together. As Vincent rightly notes these dimensions are hard to disentangle from each other. This is because the British idealist's complex conception of the social organism as a concrete universal forms the essential foundation for both. This relationship, however, works to this volume's advantage. Vincent's broad overview of idealist ethics nicely presents the context for Simhony's compelling contribution, which identifies a number of specific British idealist interventions in political thought. Importantly, Simhony shows that there is a distinctly 'idealist approach' to political philosophy, but she does this while also being clear about key distinctions between the different idealists' approaches. British idealism offers a 'third way' between 'whole-sale laissez-faire capitalism' and 'state socialism', she argues, but the British idealists themselves offer 'third ways'. Accordingly, she makes a very convincing case for the continued relevance of the idealist debates and shows that there is much to be gained from engaging with them.

The fourth part ends with an impressive and sophisticated overview of Sidgwick that provides not only an account of his ethical thought, which stresses the non-traditional nature of Sidgwick's relationship to utilitarianism and his attempt to combine it with 'ideal intuitionist' morality, but also a summary of Sidgwick's less-known contributions to politics, economics, and even psychics and metaphysics.

As already stated, the fifth part on 'Religious Philosophy' is less cohesive than the earlier parts. Nonetheless, the individual contributions retain the high level of scholarship maintained throughout the volume. They are: 'The Philosophy of James Martineau' by Ralph Waller; 'John Henry Newman' by Anthony Kenny; 'The Philosophy of Samuel Taylor Coleridge' by James Vigus; 'Scottish Religious Philosophy, 1850-1900' by Alan P. F. Sell; and, 'British Idealist Philosophy of Religion' by William Sweet. Both Kenny and Vigus argue that his thinker is deserving of greater attention as a philosopher. Kenny shows that Newman's work has been ignored partly because of his religious aims, but he convincingly argues that Newman's valuable contributions to topics concerning belief, knowledge, and certainty can be fruitfully studied independently of the religious context. Vigus argues that now that Coleridge's complete works are available, we can recognise Coleridge as a typically 'post-Kantian' philosopher. Just as 'poetic' writers such as Friedrich Schlegel and Hölderlin have now been recognized for their philosophical contributions, so should Coleridge. Vigus attempts to show this through an exposition of Coleridge's attempt to argue that the ideas of reason are constitutive rather than merely regulative through his understanding of Kant's corpus mysticum. He argues that Coleridge picks up on an understudied issue in Kant's philosophy that, if thought through coherently, can lead to an understanding of ideas as constitutive. Vigus presents an intriguing account of Coleridge's philosophy (particularly his theory of the imagination) and some hints to the value of studying him as a philosopher. Nonetheless, it is clear that the very style of Coleridge's writing makes such a study a daunting task, and the chapter will not convince everyone that it will be worth the pain.

The final section on 'The Practice of Philosophy' includes just two chapters: 'Poetry and the Philosophical Imagination' by Leslie Armour and 'The Professionalization of British Philosophy' by Stuart Brown. Armour attempts to show the important relationship that existed in the nineteenth century between poetry and philosophy. Poetry was considered, he argues, as serving a visionary function that could help philosophers break free from the fixed conceptions of accepted and existing systems. Armour presents a very useful overview of the important metaphysically inclined poets, and both their philosophical influences and influence. However, he deals with a dizzying number of authors and ideas, and the discussion is sometime hard to follow. Brown traces British philosophy's professionalization and how a discipline almost dominated by amateurs at the start of the century had almost completely removed itself from them by its end. He traces the ways the practices of universities themselves reformed during the century, the specific societies essential to philosophy's professional development (such as the Aristotelian Society) and the importance of Mind. He also compares the development of philosophical 'careers' between generations to show concretely the rapid rate of change experienced during this period. Brown's is a valuable and careful work of intellectual history that nicely ends a very valuable and important contribution to nineteenth-century British philosophy.

The Handbook provides a great deal of fecund material for future debates and should, I hope, inspire many to engage in further research on this period of thought. It certainly succeeds in showing that there would be much to be gained from such work.