The Oxford Handbook of Continental Philosophy

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Brian Leiter and Michael Rosen (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Continental Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2007, 812pp., $155.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199234097.

Reviewed by Pol Vandevelde, Marquette University


This voluminous handbook is a very welcome tool that brings out many fundamental aspects of continental philosophy and puts them in a new light in order to show their importance and relevance. By "continental philosophy" the editors mean primarily the philosophy in France and Germany in the 19th and 20th centuries. The handbook is intended for people who have been trained in the conceptual framework typical of Anglophone departments. This means that the contributors have undertaken to translate into another framework what they take to be the crucial and original points of the continental trends or philosophers they treat. Consequently, contributors have eliminated most jargon specific to authors, have chosen to focus on the aspects they deemed most important, instead of trying to be exhaustive, and have offered a critical account, instead of a general overview.

The contributors were able to do this given the editors’ decision not to present topics like "intentionality" or "phenomenological reduction," but rather themes or theses like "phenomenology as rigorous science" or "the humanism debate." The advantage of this hermeneutic decision is that all these contributions are scholarly essays in the full sense, not surveys, reviews, or general presentations. In addition, these essays are relatively long for a handbook: from 20 to 51 pages. The contributors thus have the space and the freedom to present theses, however controversial some of them may be.

The results of this massive effort at covering many different themes of continental philosophy in the form of creative and critical essays are quite impressive. All of the essays are of a very high caliber, strive toward as much clarity as possible, and do not sacrifice nuances or overlook difficulties. The scholarship of the contributors is impeccable. They are specialists in the areas they cover, and use original texts. This volume is a feat, one of the few that manages to articulate in a philosophical language mostly free of jargon the genuine multifaceted contributions of continental philosophy to the contemporary philosophical discussion.

The volume is divided into three parts: Problems of Method, Reason and Consciousness, and Human Being. The first part is dedicated to some of the methods used in continental philosophy that differ from those of the sciences and are thus in some ways anti-naturalist: phenomenology, hermeneutics, aestheticism, the history of philosophy as philosophy, historicism, the philosophy of science, and Marxism.

The first method examined is phenomenology. Taylor Carman describes the contrast between Husserl and Heidegger on what science can be and what the status of philosophy is. Carman explains the stakes of the debate in terms of two paradigms: intuition (Husserl) and interpretation (Heidegger). Husserl sees the role of categorial intuition as a response to classical empiricism. We have in perception an immediate grasp of the very logical structure of the object or state of affairs we perceive. Such a categorial grasp is primitive and foundational. By contrast, Carman argues, Heidegger rejected the categorial intuition because he saw it as a derivative capacity of a primordial way of being in the world: understanding. He thereby replaces the Husserlian ideal of pure description with an interpretation that is projected toward the future.

The next method discussed is hermeneutics, which Michael Foster understands broadly as the theory of interpretation. He provides a comprehensive survey of the different figures in the history of hermeneutics that includes the familiar figures of Ernesti, Schleiermacher, Dilthey, Ricoeur, Heidegger, Gadamer, and Derrida. However, Forster also rearranges the canon in no small fashion. He considers that the one who grounded hermeneutics for the first time is in fact Herder, who formulated the three principles that are crucial for the development of hermeneutics: meanings are word usages, thoughts are mediated by language, meanings are also grounded in perception. This means that Schleiermacher, commonly regarded as the founder of modern hermeneutics, has been dethroned. For, Forster argues, his contribution to hermeneutics is "fairly modest." Forster also gives a place to Friedrich Schlegel and Hegel. More remarkably, he considers that J.L. Austin and Quentin Skinner with their theory and application of the illocutionary force have contributed to hermeneutics far more significantly than Heidegger, Gadamer, and Derrida. Forster ends his essay by arguing for a broadening of the scope of hermeneutics and that this broadening should include, for instance, a hermeneutic of the use of language by some animals (like the bonobo apes).

In "Philosophical Aestheticism" Sebastian Gardner defends the view that art and affect are not merely topics of philosophical reflection, but are philosophically cognitive and thus part of the grounding of philosophical thought. He explains the status of this cognition through art and affect by reviewing several forms of aestheticism like German romanticism, Merleau-Ponty, Heidegger, and Adorno, as well as the critics of aestheticism.

Another method of continental philosophy uses the history of philosophy as a way of doing philosophy. Michael Rosen identifies four components of the philosophical use of the history of philosophy: 1) a historical examination of philosophical arguments as they have been used in the past or present by focusing on their assumptions and background, 2) a questioning of such arguments through a historical interpretation, 3) historical interpretation as a persuasive means rather than a demonstrative one, and 4) historical interpretation aimed at showing the fabric in which these presuppositions were used, thereby explaining how readers could be persuaded, given the context of origin of the arguments. He examines the use of history as a philosophical method by Hegel, Marx, Nietzsche, and Heidegger, and evaluates their legacy.

In "Historicism" Frederick Beiser reviews some of the main efforts that have been made to legitimate history as a science. Beiser considers historicism as one of the most important intellectual movements of the 19th century against which many figures in German philosophy reacted at the end of the 19th and in the early 20th century. The significance of historicism consists in its break with the enlightenment and its questioning of the possibility of finding procedures of justification for social, political or moral values that transcend historical boundaries. Beiser draws attention to the potential ambiguities of the term, which was used retrospectively to label historians like Ranke who did not describe himself as such. In addition, most of these "historicists" were historians and not philosophers. Thus their primary focus was not on moral issues. Furthermore, historicism covers both those, like Herder and the German idealists, who attempted to find general laws of history a meaning of historicism that Karl Popper popularized, and those, like Ranke, Droysen and Dilthey, who wanted to grasp the uniquely individual.

In his contribution "What Have We Been Missing? Science and Philosophy in Twentieth-Century French Thought," Gary Gutting examines the different trends in the philosophy of science practiced by French philosophers during the 20th century and identifies three attitudes in French thought to approach science: the positivist, critical and ontological attitudes. The positivist attitude is the one adopted by those scientists and philosophers like Poincaré, Duhem, and Meyerson, who were very much involved in science. This trend became the dominant direction of the philosophy of science in the Anglo-American world. The critical attitude resulted from a renewal of Kantian thinking and was adopted by figures like Bachelard and Canguilhem, and transformed by Foucault (in a fascinating section, Gutting shows how Bachelard's and Canguilhem's models can reformulate Thomas Kuhn's problematic). The ontological attitude is illustrated essentially by Bergson and Merleau-Ponty, who reacted and responded to scientism. While showing the originality and fruitfulness of the ontological attitude, Gutting also warns against what he calls "philosophism": the fact that science cannot account for some domain does not mean that there is a non-scientific philosophical method to know this truth. He suggests that philosophies are more like novels, providing perspectives that have their own relative value.

The last method examined is Marxist critique. Alex Callinicos examines several versions of critiques in Marxism and post-Marxism provided by Lukács, Althusser, the Frankfurt school, and some more recent figures like Habermas, Hardt and Negri, Badiou and Bourdieu.

The second part of the handbook is titled "Reason and Consciousness" and examines several issues including the tensions between naturalism and nihilism, the question of the limits of reason, whether epistemology can be overcome, the question of individual identity, and the status of consciousness as situated in the world.

In the first essay of the section, Paul Franks reviews some of the forms of transcendental philosophy in post-Kantianism (Jacobi, Fries), German idealism (Reinhold, Fichte, Schelling, Hegel), and psycho-physiological and anti-psychologistic neo-Kantianism (the positions of Helmholtz and Lotze leading to the Marburg Neo-Kantianism of Cohen and the Southwest Neo-Kantianism of Windelband). All these forms struggled with the two problems that transcendental philosophy faced at its inception with Kant: naturalist skepticism and nihilism. These two problems, moreover, were to give rise to the analytic and continental traditions respectively, with the latter being concerned additionally with historicity and the human sciences, and thus anti-naturalist. Franks sees an ambiguity in the status of Kant's own version of transcendental philosophy as one reason for these divergent interpretations and continuations of Kant: since this philosophy disqualifies metaphysics, it could be merely concerned with cognition and thus becomes an epistemology; or, since the conditions of possibility for knowledge are also the conditions of possibility for the objects of knowledge, it could also be an ontology.

In "Dialectic, Value Objectivity, and the Unity of Reason," Fred Rush examines some responses in Post-Kantian European philosophy to the problem of how human subjective faculties can account for the objectivity of the claims they make about objects in the world. He focuses on those responses that he thinks have been neglected and contrasts German idealism and German romanticism. He sees Habermas and Adorno, respectively, as 20th century representatives of these two trends. While Adorno and the romantics inherit from Kant the view that there is a balance between the limits of what we can know and the human tendency to think in ways that exceed those limitations, Habermas and German idealism inherit another side of Kant's project: striving to find a foundation for the universalistic claims of reason.

The next essay, "Overcoming Epistemology" by Herman Philipse, follows naturally from the previous ones. While continental philosophy is rarely associated with epistemology, Philipse offers an insightful way to think about the problem of epistemology by situating this problem in a larger historical and philosophical context. He distinguishes among different senses of epistemology, including the attempt to resolve the problem of the external world, as formulated by Descartes, Leibniz, Locke, Berkeley, Hume, and Kant. Philipse then shows how at the end of the 19th century this type of epistemology, which he calls "external world epistemology," became a discipline that is fundamental in philosophy in the form of a first philosophy. He then compares the two projects of Husserl and Heidegger as two different attempts, albeit unsuccessful, to overcome epistemology in the form of a transcendental philosophy and a fundamental ontology respectively.

In "Individual Existence and the Philosophy of Difference," Robert Stern examines the problem of individuality by focusing on how Hegel dealt with it as a "concrete universal" and how critics like Feuerbach and Kierkegaard reacted to Hegel's views. Stern then discusses what has been called, following Deleuze, a "philosophy of difference."

In closing the second part of the volume, Peter Poellner tackles the very notion of consciousness in "Consciousness in the World" by examining Husserlian phenomenology. Against common understanding, Poellner argues that Husserl's theory of intentionality is externalist and endeavors to re-interpret the transcendental reduction in a rather original way: the reduction does not lead back to an immanent sphere of consciousness, in the Cartesian manner, but aims at making the natural attitude transparent to the subject, thereby providing a self-disclosure of subjectivity, but also of the world as its correlate.

The third part of the handbook is simply titled "Human Being" and covers such issues as the meaning of life, the place of God in philosophy, what it means to be at home, freedom and autonomy, the role of Greece in German thought, the place and influence of the Frankfurt School in practical philosophy, the place of humanism, and the social and political role of morality.

In "Nihilism and the Meaning of Life," Julian Young distinguishes two strategies to react to Nietzsche's prediction of the arrival of nihilism. The first strategy is illustrated by Camus, who heroically maintains that even if there is a loss of meaning, it does not amount to the disappearing of the worth of life. Nietzsche himself illustrates the second strategy and claims that the death of God does not amount to the loss of meaning. Young shows how Sartre continues the Nietzschean path and defends self-creation and how the early and late Heidegger represent two different attempts to overcome the shortcomings of both Nietzsche and Sartre.

Stephen Mulhall examines the place of God and probes the philosophy of religion in post-Kantian philosophy, dividing the task into several questions: how the existence of the Christian God was seen by Kant, Nietzsche, and Kierkegaard, how Kierkegaard understood the existential significance of religious belief and the relation to an absolute that is incarnate, and how Heidegger and Sartre understood finitude.

In "Being at Home: Human Beings and Human Bodies," Maximilian de Gaynesford examines the connection, central in continental philosophy, between being human and being at home. This connection was famously made by Novalis, when he expressed the "urge to be everywhere at home," as well as by Adorno's statement that "today, it is part of morality not to be at home in one's home." De Gaynesford focuses on Heidegger and reviews some elements of a Heideggerian anthropology and of Merleau-Ponty's alternative.

The problem of freedom is treated by Kenneth Baynes, who retraces some milestones in continental philosophy's account of autonomy. After a section on Rousseau, Baynes examines the dual account offered by Kant and Hegel on freedom as autonomy and how Nietzsche, Sartre and Heidegger reacted to these accounts. Baynes shows the multiple facets of autonomy as "self-governing," which has defined much of what it means to be "modern." In the last part he examines some recent attempts to think autonomy as relational or recognitional in Habermas, Anderson and Honneth, Christman, Benson, and Forst.

While not a usual component of what it means to be human, the theme studied by Jessica Berry in "The Legacy of Hellenic Harmony" was in fact essential to how German philosophers understood the norms and ideals of how to be human. She retraces the history of the fascination German philosophy has had with Hellenic culture and how what was perceived as the Greek ideals came to be seen as the modern eudaimonia. She shows the significant influence of Winckelman on Lessing, Herder, Goethe and Schiller in the establishment of the Greek model of a free spirit manifesting "noble simplicity and quiet grandeur"; she then shows how Kant rejected this Greek ethics and how idealism and early German romanticism reacted to Kant. Berry ends by showing the specificity of Nietzsche's and Heidegger's retrieval of the Greeks.

The next contribution by James Gordon Finlayson also focuses on a specifically German aspect of continental philosophy. He offers a detailed analysis of the practical philosophy of the Frankfurt school, explaining what critical theory is, how it arose, and what its aims were. Critical theory, in Horkheimer's view, is a philosophical theory of society that has a diagnostic aim of showing what goes wrong with the institutions or practices of a society and a remedial aim of transforming the social situation in order to eliminate social injustice. Finlayson examines how Marx and Lukács understood the term and the practice of "critique" or "criticism," and how Horkheimer and Adorno developed their critique of instrumental reason. Finlayson devotes a section to Habermas and how he expanded critical theory toward a political theory and an ethics of discourse, thereby significantly reformulating the very nature of critical theory: its role is no longer to criticize society from a moral point of view, stating what ought to be done, but rather to describe or "reconstruct," for example, the moral competence of citizens or to show how justification works as a social process.

Thomas Baldwin essay focuses on humanism. He reexamines the debate between Sartre and Heidegger about humanism, with Sartre presenting existentialism as a humanism and Heidegger speaking against humanism. He also discusses the positions of both Foucault, who follows Heidegger in believing that we need to go beyond the presuppositions about individual subjects, and Derrida, who deconstructs the very idea of authenticity and points to the interplay between the general and the personal.

The last essay of the volume is by Brian Leiter on "Morality Critics." He reviews the positions of those post-Kantian European philosophers whom he characterizes as questioners of the necessity of morality, because they saw it as an obstacle to personal flourishing. Leiter divides these critics into two camps. There are the "direct morality critics," like Nietzsche and Freud, for whom morality in itself prevents personal flourishing and is thus a direct threat, and the "indirect morality critics," like Marx and some members of the Frankfurt School, who see morality as an indirect threat, being among the instruments used to promote and maintain socio-economic structures that impede personal flourishing. Leiter sees Foucault as a special case since he belongs to both camps. Foucault's notion of "bio-power" aims at explaining how individuals are themselves agents of their own control by forming their judgments along the normality provided by the human sciences, so that they themselves hamper their flourishing -- in this way he is like the direct morality critics. However, Foucault holds that individuals are also oppressed through the institutions that have been established to normalize the knowledge provided by the human sciences -- which makes him an indirect morality critic. Leiter ends the essay by critiquing these views and briefly comparing them with the criticism of morality in English-speaking philosophy, making a case that the continental critique of morality should be part of moral theory.

The volume ends with an extensive forty-page bibliography with the primary sources followed by the other works referenced. It also has a fifteen-page index that makes the handbook very user-friendly.

In keeping with the nature of a handbook, several essays often focus on the same thinker, but since each essay has its own thesis, these overlaps are not repetitious. They are, rather, useful and enlightening, because we see these philosophers from a variety of perspectives, with different questions posed by each essay.

As stated at the outset, these perspectives and questions originate from an Anglo-American way of doing philosophy so that, of necessity, the thinkers and trends examined are interpreted from within this grid and thus not arguably on their own terms. While this lens provides a net gain in clarity and conceptual articulation, it also limits the extent to which these continental thinkers can challenge the vocabulary, framework, and perspectives in which they are cast. While, for example, it may be useful to use the internalism-externalism distinction to lay out the crucial themes within Husserl's epistemological project, it may also inhibit the possibility present within Husserlian phenomenology of moving beyond this debate. And while it is enlightening to translate Merleau-Ponty's views into a set of syllogistic propositions, doing so may result in our losing the means to question the genesis of the propositional level in the first place. The vocabulary, the genres of writing, or the particular use of language typical of continental philosophers was not merely a means of expression that can be translated without loss, but also a means to come back to what matters to them, to the Sachen selbst, and it is also through these means that readers can be brought back to share these insights. This is something that must be borne in mind when we attempt to translate the pursuits of continental philosophy into a new framework.

In sum, this handbook is a remarkable achievement. On the one hand, the scope of the themes and authors is large enough to count as an excellent overview of the many facets of continental philosophy; on the other hand, the creative and critical nature of the contributions provides a thorough and in-depth discussion of the trends making up continental philosophy. It is both a scholarly work providing a large amount of information and a philosophical work testing and assessing the originality and fruitfulness of continental philosophy. If a case had to be made about the relevance, originality, and fruitfulness of the continental approaches, this handbook makes it rather convincingly and brilliantly.