The Oxford Handbook of Hobbes

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A.P. Martinich and Kinch Hoekstra (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Hobbes, Oxford University Press, 2016, 649pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199791941.

Reviewed by Marcus P. Adams, State University of New York at Albany


This book represents a significant contribution to scholarship on Hobbes. It is impressive in both breadth and depth, with twenty-six essays devoted to various aspects of Hobbes's thought. A.P. Martinich notes in his introduction that the goal of the book is neither to be comprehensive nor to review the secondary literature; rather, the objective is "advance the study of Hobbes's thought" (p. 1). Overall, the essays are of high quality and the group of authors, composed of historians of philosophy, political theorists, and historians of ideas, among others, is representative of the best of contemporary scholarship on Hobbes.

The book has five parts: Logic and Natural Philosophy (Part I), Human Nature and Moral Philosophy (Part II), Political Philosophy (Part III), Religion (Part IV), and History, Poetry, and Paradox (Part V). Martinich provides an introduction that distills Hobbes's life and times and also indicates some of the key themes in Hobbes's philosophy by connecting them to the essays in the volume. Like the book itself, I do not intend to be comprehensive, but I will highlight the advances in our understanding of Hobbes that I take the book to be making.

Martine Pécharman's "Hobbes on Logic, or How to Deal with Aristotle's Legacy" begins Part I by distinguishing Hobbes's criticisms of the use of logic for theological and metaphysical ends and Aristotle's logic itself. She argues convincingly that Hobbes consistently avoids criticizing Aristotle himself on matters of logic, but instead focuses on the improper application of logic to domains in which philosophy has nothing to say, such as theology, since there we cannot reason from known effects to possible causes or from known causes to effects. She articulates this relationship to Aristotle as Hobbes seeking to accommodate scholastic-Aristotelian terminology to his nominalism; as she notes, Hobbes's instruction to John Bramhall to consult De Corpore chapter 6 for reasons why the law of defining by genus and difference should be understood in terms of a relationship between names shows that Hobbes's account in De Corpore is "compatible with keeping traditional logic" (p. 30). Pécharman's essay cogently shows how Hobbes combines this account of logic with his view of human nature, as early as Elements of Law, and that this connection with human reasoners (or rather, ratiocinators) makes clear why the logic that Hobbes offers there is, as she says, "fragmentary" and not "logic for logic's sake" (pp. 31-32).

Stewart Duncan's essay on Hobbes's views on language treats different positive accounts that Hobbes offers over a fifteen-year period in the Elements of Law, Leviathan, and De Corpore. He distinguishes these positive accounts of language from Hobbes's critical project, which aims to show, especially in Leviathan, the "absurd" uses of language by other philosophers. One such development that Duncan discusses is Hobbes's move from seeing names as having the primary role of private marks in Elements of Law to also being public signs in Leviathan and De Corpore. Duncan interestingly connects two lists of reasons why assertions are absurd that Hobbes provides, one in Leviathan and the other in De Corpore, and from them abstracts a principle behind Hobbes's reasoning that holds that one should not combine "two names of different kinds in a proposition of the form 'A is B'" (67ff). For example, one should not give the name of a body to an accident. Why exactly one is prohibited from doing this sort of combining in a proposition is not immediately clear from Hobbes's exposition. One might take a Rylean approach and see restrictions in terms of a theory of categories; however, Duncan argues instead that Hobbes's more detailed approach in De Corpore suggests that sentences that, for example, give the name of a body to an accident, are not the fault of logic but rather are simply false. To support this interpretation, Duncan concludes by examining Hobbes's reasoning about three such examples from De Corpore.

Katherine Dunlop's "Hobbes's Mathematical Thought" (chapter 4) examines Hobbes's views of mathematics, seeing him as failing to achieve originality in geometry but nevertheless finding commonalities among Hobbes, Newton, and Kant. Even if we view Hobbesian mathematics as a failure, Dunlop advances the discussion by showing how "other thinkers [such as Kant and Newton] succeeded by its means" (78). She begins by considering Hobbes's relationship to classical views of ratio and proportion, and clarifies the context of his various attempts to square the circle. In doing so, she corrects the claim of some Hobbes scholars who have seen the problem of squaring the circle as manifestly impossible even in Hobbes's time (82-84). The connection that Dunlop makes between Hobbes and Kant regarding the way to arrive at generality from a particular constructed figure will be of interest to philosophers of mathematics generally, as well as to those interested in the link between Hobbes's mathematics and natural philosophy.

The next two chapters on Hobbes's natural philosophy complement one another and advance our understanding of Hobbes's views in this area. In the first (chapter 5), Daniel Garber places Hobbes's natural philosophy within the broader context of the 17th century. There is a long tradition in scholarship on Hobbes of seeing Hobbes as indebted to Galileo. However, there are significant differences between Hobbes and Galileo as seen, for example, in Hobbes's placement of the definitions of 'body' and 'motion' within his first philosophy (De Corpore, Part II) and his discussion of the consequences of 'magnitudes' and 'motions' within his geometry (De Corpore, Part III). Garber articulates this difference as Hobbes providing an account of body and motion as such and not, as in the case of Galileo, an account of heavy bodies in motion. As a result, the picture of Hobbesian natural philosophy that emerges is closer in aim to Descartes than to Galileo, where we see both Descartes in Principia Philosophiae and Hobbes in De Corpore as "involved in a kind of Aristotelian scientia, an account of nature in terms of its ultimate causes" (p. 117). The legacy of Hobbes's natural philosophy in Spinoza and Leibniz, with which Garber concludes the chapter, will be of interest to historians of philosophy generally.

Douglas Jesseph's chapter 6 examines the relationship between two parts of De Corpore: the part on Hobbes's first philosophy (Part II) and the part on his physica, or natural philosophy (Part IV). Before addressing the physical principles of Hobbesian natural philosophy, Jesseph connects Hobbes's introduction in De Corpore 7 (Part II) of the distinction between imaginary and real space with his discussion in the unpublished Anti-White (1642-43). The concept of space is an accident of body or magnitude and has mind-dependent (imaginary) and a mind-independent (real) aspects. Time is an accident of motion and is mind-dependent since one must track motion to have time. Jesseph notes an oddity of Hobbes's framework insofar as Hobbes seeks to understand space and time in terms of body (magnitude) and motion and not the other way around. Next Jesseph discusses two principles that Hobbes saw as demonstrable only from the basic definitions of space, time, motion, and body; Jesseph calls these the persistence principle and the principle of action by contact (pp. 140-141). These principles rely upon consideration only of these basic definitions, and we putatively arrive at principles from them by considering what is conceivable (that which is inconceivable, such as self-motion, is physically impossible for Hobbes). The picture of Hobbes's natural philosophy in practice that Jesseph provides is nuanced, and the details matter: on the one hand, Hobbes rejects the doctrine of rarefaction and condensation since it contradicts his two physical principles, but, on the other hand, he rejects arguments for the existence of vaccua on empirical grounds. These details and the connection to Steven Shapin and Simon Schaffer's understanding of Hobbes's natural philosophy that Jesseph provides will be of interest generally to historians of science as well as historians of philosophy.

The final chapter of Part I (chapter 7) by Franco Giudice treats Hobbes's optical work, which Hobbes claimed in A Minute or First Draught of the Optiques would gain him recognition as the founder of two sciences (the other science being the science of "natural justice" in De Cive). Giudice introduces Hobbes's optics by reflecting on early criticisms Hobbes makes of Walter Warner; Hobbes's complaint in 29 July/8 August 1636 correspondence to William Cavendish is that Warner's explanations of alchemical phenomena are merely geometrical and fail to posit physical causes. Furthermore, Giudice traces the development of Hobbes's views on the nature of light from thinking of it as diastole and systole to his later thinking of it in terms of what Hobbes calls "simple circular motion."

Part II begins with Thomas Pink's "Hobbes on Liberty, Action, and Free Will." Pink traces different conceptions of freedom prior to Hobbes to contextualize Hobbes's challenge to Bramhall as well as differences between Hobbes and Suarez. Adrian Blau's "Reason, Deliberation, and the Passions" seeks to correct what he sees as a misinterpretation of Hobbes as viewing reason as slave of the passions. Rather than seeing reason as contrasted to the passions, he argues that Hobbes's project distinguishes passions aimed at our "real good" from those directed at mere "apparent good." If this interpretation of Hobbes is correct, reason's role is uncertain, so Blau articulates reason as the "counselor" of the passions. A main point he seeks to make is that while reason is not motivational for Hobbes, seeing it as a slave, at the beck and call of the passions considered as a whole, misrepresents the role that reason plays in helping sort out which passions do, in fact, motivate a given action or the role reason may play in instructing us not to follow some passion. Blau's argument is cogent; his thesis argues against a widely held view in scholarship on Hobbes and will be of special interest to those attentive to the relationship of Hume's views to Hobbes's.

Ioannis D. Evrigenis' "The State of Nature" begins by considering how Leviathan 13 fits together with the chapters surrounding it. Evrigenis interestingly tracks the development of Hobbes's accounts of the state of nature from Elements of Law and De Cive to the Leviathan where Hobbes's treatment of the possibility and plausibility of the state of nature is expanded (pp. 231-233). Evrigenis comments that it seems "paradoxical" that the state of nature, which "falls far short of [Hobbes's] stated standards of precision" (p. 222), would be one of the most prominent features of his legacy. The contrast Evrigenis has mind is between chapter 13 and the preceding chapters, where Hobbes moves "through a series of painstaking definitions of the minutiae of human nature and behavior" (p. 222). However, we might see chapter 13, and the thought experiment within it, to use contemporary terms, as in accord with what Hobbes does elsewhere when we find him engaging in a similar thought experiment at the foundation of his 'first philosophy' in De Corpore 7. There he founds his 'first philosophy' with the following claim, before he gives a thought experiment: "We will understand the beginning of the teaching of nature best . . . from privation, i.e., from the feigned removal of the universe" (Latin Works, vol. I, p. 81).

In chapter 11, "Hobbes on the Family," Nancy Hirschmann addresses a topic often neglected in Hobbes scholarship. She cogently argues that the nature of the family is indeed a central concern of Hobbes's and shows how this relates to his account of women. Hirschmann traces Hobbes's views of equality between men and women in the state of nature and contrasts this with Hobbes's definition of the 'family' in Leviathan as "a man and his children; or . . . a man and his servants; or . . . a man, and his children, and servants together" (p. 246). How Hobbes can understand the family in this way, where women seem to be acting as servants by 'consent' or else are outside of the family, when he has claimed that men and women are equal in the state of nature is very much an unresolved question in Hobbes scholarship, as Hirschmann convincingly argues. His answer to this question directs our attention to the claims that Hobbes makes concerning the competitive nature of men in the state of nature, especially as it relates to "mak[ing] themselves master of other men's persons, wives, children, and cattell" (p. 258). Given this view of natural men, Hirschmann's solution requires that the sovereign must legislate patriarchal families after the social contract as a way of maintaining peace in the commonwealth.

S.A. Lloyd's "Natural Law" (chapter 12) argues that reciprocity is the "core requirement" of the laws of nature. Section 6, where she discusses the duties that sovereigns may have to one another, will be of interest to those concerned about the status of international treaties in a Hobbesian light. In addition, her taxonomy and discussion in section 10 of one of the central debates in Hobbes scholarship -- the question of why the laws of nature are normative -- will be of great interest to scholars and students alike.

As a general comment on the Handbook itself, the placement of Lloyd's chapter, immediately after those on the state of nature (chapter 10) and on the family (chapter 11), in which the 'natural' family is considered, tracks the ordering of topics in the Leviathan where Hobbes treats the Laws of Nature in chapters 14-15. However, Lloyd's is the final chapter in Part II, and we might also expect in this part a treatment of Leviathan 16 ("Of Persons, Authors, and Things Personated"). That chapter is a transition in Leviathan between "Of Man" (The first part) and "Of Commonwealth" (The second part). This is not meant as a criticism, especially since there is treatment of concepts from Leviathan 16 elsewhere in Part III (Political Philosophy) of the Handbook, such as in Martinich's discussion of persons and representation in chapter 14 (cf. 324ff). Instead, this comment is meant to highlight Hobbes's choice to discuss the concepts of 'person', 'author', and 'things personated' within "Of Man" and not within the part of Leviathan on civil philosophy (something Martinich himself also mentions on p. 327 fn. 43).

John Deigh's "Political Obligation" begins the section on political philosophy (Part III).[1] In articulating Hobbes's account of political obligation, Deigh focuses exclusively upon the text of the Leviathan, an approach that he has taken elsewhere (John Deigh, "Reason and Ethics in Hobbes's Leviathan," Journal of the History of Philosophy 34.1 [1996], pp. 33-60). A difficulty that this approach encounters becomes apparent in section 2 of the chapter where Deigh discusses Hobbes's "scientific method." Citing the "Table of the Several Subjects of Science" from Leviathan 9, Deigh notes that the "different branches [of science] included ethics and politics as well as mechanics, astronomy, geology, and optics" (p. 296). These disciplines do appear on the "Table," but that fails to tell us whether Hobbes follows the same method in each. To find Hobbes's method, one must leave the Leviathan and examine Hobbes's practice in, say, optics (e.g., in De Homine) or natural philosophy (e.g., in De Corpore, Part IV). Indeed, in the Leviathan itself, Hobbes notes in chapter 1 that there he will "briefly deliver" the summary of what he has "else-where written" (Hobbes 1996, p. 13).

The broader corpus shows two kinds of Hobbesian sciences: those in which we know actual causes, namely only geometry and civil philosophy since we "make" geometrical figures and the commonwealth (see English Works vol. VII, p. 184; see also Latin Works, vol. II, pp. 93-94), and those in which we posit possible causes (these occur throughout De Corpore Part IV[2]). These points that I have made related to our understanding of Hobbes's "scientific method" might seem beside the issue of political obligation; however, on Deigh's view since Hobbes's politics is a "contribution to science," his method of science must be the starting point to understanding obligation. For example, he uses his understanding of Hobbes's "method of science" as a piece of evidence in favor of his interpretation of obligation against the divine command interpretation (p. 308). I agree with this view of the need to understand Hobbes's science, but I disagree with Deigh on the nature of Hobbesian scientific method.

What Deigh's characterization misses, insofar as it relies exclusively on the Leviathan, is Hobbes's insistence that in causal sciences, such as geometry (e.g., criticisms of Euclid's definitions at English Works vol. VII, p. 184 and English Works vol. VII, p. 202), the cause or generation of the thing defined must be in the definition. Since we can be in possession of actual causes in geometry (and likewise in civil philosophy), we give definitions that instruct how to do something; the definition "a line is made from the motion of a point" (Latin Works vol. I, p. 63) is an example. On this view of Hobbesian (causal) science, definitions serve not "as instructions concerning with what words one can replace other words when one is adding and subtracting them" (pace Deigh, p. 312) but rather as instructions regarding how to do something, such as how to make a line or a commonwealth.

Martinich's chapter treats two of the most central concepts in Hobbes's civil philosophy: authorization and representation. Martinich begins by considering the first part of what he calls the "sovereign-making formula" from Leviathan 17: "I Authorise and give up my right of Governing my selfe, to this man, or to this Assembly of men" (p. 316). Since the object of 'authorise' is not apparent, the formula as in Leviathan is grammatically incoherent, which Martinich cogently attributes to Hobbes's attempt in Leviathan 17 to blend two concepts that conflict with one another in the formulation given there: authorization and alienation. Hobbes's treatment in Leviathan 21 avoids this difficulty, which Martinich suggests may be related to Hobbes's opposition to republicanism there and the resulting need to emphasize 'authorization' (p. 320 fn. 13). The second section of Martinich's chapter concerns persons and representation. Here he shows that the resolution of complications in understanding the account of natural and non-natural persons in Leviathan 16 is not aided by the related passages in the Latin edition of Leviathan (1668) and De Homine (1658), each of which presents its own difficulties. Martinich closes the chapter by arguing that in Leviathan the primary relationship of concern to Hobbes is between the sovereign and the subject, a relationship that is created by authorization. He grounds this view by seeing the commonwealth as epiphenomenal upon the sovereign's acts, and thereby avoiding seeing the commonwealth itself as the author of the sovereign's actions (pp. 332-333).

Remaining chapters of particular note in Part III are Mark Murphy's on "Hobbes (and Austin, and Aquinas) on Law as Command of the Sovereign" (chapter 15) and Arash Abizadeh's on "Sovereign Jurisdiction, Territorial Rights, and Membership in Hobbes" (chapter 18).

Part IV opens with Agostino Lupoli's "Hobbes and Religion without Theology" (chapter 20). He commences by discussing how Hobbes's "theory of science" in De Corpore, which text he understands as the only place in which "Hobbes expounds his complete doctrine of science" (p. 455). The account in De Corpore excludes theology from the subject of philosophy. However, the notion of God as first cause is intelligible for Hobbes because he requires something to begin motions in bodies; Lupoli traces how Hobbes appeals to this demonstration to reject charges of atheism, for example, in the Appendix to the Leviathan (p. 458). Furthermore, Lupoli perceives two aspects, what he calls "needs," of human nature as behind Hobbes's approach to God: "the rational one driving to the philosophical God and the passional one demanding worship of a God regarded as sensitive to men's manifestations of honor and submissiveness" (p. 475).

Jeffrey Collins' "Thomas Hobbes on Ecclesiastical History" begins by considering Hobbes's taxonomical division of history into "natural history" and "civil history," noting how Hobbes fails to mention a natural additional category: sacred history. Nevertheless, Hobbes uses the terms "sacred history" and "holy history" and himself provides such history. Collins' chapter argues that Hobbes anticipates later Enlightenment themes and suggests that perhaps, given our post-Enlightenment position, we read Hobbes as less ingenious in his view of sacred history as we should. Section 4 ("Ecclesiastical History as Coded Philosophy") will be of particular interest for its account of Hobbes's development of sacred history in his later works and Hobbes's attempts to argue against the prosecution of heresies.

Two chapters of the final section (Part V) are noteworthy. Kinch Hoekstra's "Hobbes's Thucydides" examines Hobbes's Eight Bookes of the Peloponnesian Warre with an eye to Hobbes's purposes in the translation of Thucydides as well as the extent to which what we can infer about Hobbes's views at the time of the translation coheres with his later, more developed views. Timothy Raylor's "Hobbes on the Nature and Scope of Poetry" (chapter 26) is particularly stimulating given its examination of Hobbes's views of poetry not only in the Leviathan but also in the so-called Anti-White (1642-43), which contains Hobbes's criticisms of Thomas White's De Mundo (1642).

In general, the editors are to be commended for an even treatment of the topics that were included, made evident, for example, by the fact that 6 chapters are devoted to Logic and Natural Philosophy (Part I) and 7 are devoted to Political Philosophy (Part III). I do have one item to note about the sections. The book succeeds in its treatment of Hobbes's views with consideration of his many interests. Most of the authors do this by paying close attention to the text of the Hobbes corpus and to his interlocutors or detractors. However, it might have been useful to include, in addition, a section on the reception of Hobbes's views and works. Many of the contributors do, of course, address issues related to reception.

This and the other criticisms that I have offered in this review should not be taken to detract from volume as a whole. Overall, the book will serve excellently as a resource for scholars and advanced students. The depth and breadth of The Oxford Handbook of Hobbes will give its reader the impression (correct, in my mind) that scholarship on Thomas Hobbes is alive and well. The book sets the standard for future work on Hobbes.

[1] Readers may also wish to consult the debate regarding entries in the Handbook that has been featured on the blog of the European Hobbes Society; featured so far on the blog has been a debate between John Deigh and A.P. Martinich on Deigh's contribution to the book (accessed October 1, 2016). Deigh's reply to Martinich (accessed October 1, 2016) is also available.

[2] For example, see Hobbes's reference to the "possible cause of the light of the sun" in De Corpore 27 (Latin Works, vol. I, p. 365).