The Oxford Handbook of Kierkegaard

Placeholder book cover

John Lippitt and George Pattison (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Kierkegaard, Oxford University Press, 2013, 610pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199601301.

Reviewed by Thomas P. Miles, Boston College


In this prodigious collection, John Lippitt and George Pattison have brought together some of the most established and innovative Kierkegaard scholars. The volume is impressive both for its range and the quality of its contributions. In what follows, I make some general remarks about the volume as a whole and then discuss six of the essays in greater detail.

In their introduction, the editors signal their intention to "provide an enduring resource for students and scholars for a long time to come" and present "a good cross section of the current state of play of Kierkegaard studies in the English-speaking world" (7). The stature of several of the contributors (as well as of Oxford University Press) will undoubtedly assure the first of these goals. The book's scholarly level will probably put it out of reach for undergraduates not studying Kierkegaard at an advanced level. But it will undoubtedly become a central source for graduate students and professional scholars for many years to come. This is not only due to the breadth and stature of the contributors, but also because in a broadly accessible way the authors succinctly present their work on particular topics about which they have become leading voices. For example, Bruce Kirmmse writes on Kierkegaard and the Danish Golden Age, M. Jamie Ferreira on Kierkegaard's conception of love, Rick Furtak on Kierkegaard's relation to ancient Greek philosophy, Brian Söderquist on Kierkegaard's use of irony, and Alastair Hannay on translating Kierkegaard.

The volume's sheer size and scope, an introduction and twenty-nine essays, already does much to ensure the second goal of presenting a good cross section of current Kierkegaard scholarship. In addition, the editors seem to have taken particular care to be as inclusive and comprehensive as possible in their selection of topics and voices. Themes common to many of the essays are the importance of understanding things within their wider context, openness to differing views and perspectives, and attemping to reconcil opposing readings of Kierkegaard. These themes are reflected in the volume's organization as well.

The volume has three sections. The first, "Contexts and Sources," locates Kierkegaard's authorship within a variety of contexts: historical, cultural, philosophical and theological. This establishes what the editors hope will be the basis for the book's interpretative essays. The second section, "Some Major Topics in the Authorship," consists of essays on some of the most central issues and ideas that run through Kierkegaard's corpus (e.g., selfhood, love, irony, modernity, death) and his use of pseudonyms and other literary techniques. This section also includes essays on Kierkegaard's theology and how his work relates to contemporary ethics. In their introduction, the editors make clear their refusal to examine other, more particular ideas in Kierkegaard (such as 'the absurd,' 'despair' and a 'leap of faith') outside of a broader context. They note that "a focus on such terms, torn out of their context" has "been responsible for some of the worst misreadings of Kierkegaard over the last century and a half, such as the often repeated charge that Kierkegaard was an 'irrationalist', propounding a version of faith that is radically opposed to reason and proud of it." (4) (As their example suggests, this volume is dismissive only of those readings of Kierkegaard that are themselves dismissive, e.g., arguments that Kierkegaard can only be read as a theologian, or only as a poet.) The third section, "Kierkegaard After Kierkegaard," traces Kierkegaard's reception by a range of philosophical, theological, and literary figures and traditions. Special attention is paid to Kierkegaard's relationship to three thinkers -- Nietzsche, Heidegger, and Wittgenstein -- with an essay devoted to each.

Assuming that the book accomplishes the goal of having a lasting influence on future Kierkegaard studies while offering a cross section of current Kierkegaard scholarship, several questions arise. First, insofar as this will be an influential volume, what specifically will be its likely influence on the world's understanding and reception of Kierkegaard? What overall impression of Kierkegaard and his authorship emerges from this collection? Second, what does this cross-section of Kierkegaard scholarship suggest about Kierkegaard scholarship today?

There is an understandable (and particularly Kierkegaardian) worry that a person's true life and life's work become obscured in important ways when picked apart and meticulously analyzed by a weighty scholarly apparatus. While this might be true in some respects, for the most part this volume has the opposite effect, helping to bring Kierkegaard and his authorship freshly to life. The Søren Kierkegaard presented here is subtly responsive to a range of influences but remains fiercely independent and uniquely creative. He is a thinker of penetrating insight and profound wisdom, perhaps no more so than when he is at his wittiest. He is also a peculiar and complex kind of poet, capable of invoking a range of human experiences from the depths of despair to the joy of forgiveness. At 200, we find Kierkegaard in good 'fighting shape', poised to add a powerful voice to a range of contemporary discussions, offering in turn devastating negative critiques and compelling positive alternatives. One lasting influence of the volume will surely be to further promote the presence and clarity of Kierkegaard's voice in these discussions.

The collection suggests that Kierkegaard scholars are particularly interested in articulating Kierkegaard's positive contributions. This not to say that Kierkegaard's incisive critiques of so many aspects of modern life are overlooked or downplayed, but in addition to grappling with these critiques, Kierkegaard scholars seem intent on addressing what is perhaps the more difficult but important task of articulating what Kierkegaard promotes instead. In particular, there is an interest in saying whatever can be said about that specifically Christian (and peculiarly Kierkegaardian) way of living, which  Kierkegaard calls the life of faith. Kierkegaard's works say a lot about what faith is not, and a good portion of Kierkegaard scholarship since his death has been devoted to these criticisms. Kierkegaard scholarship today seems more intent on finding hints in his texts as to what faith is, what is entailed and required in the life of faith. One small indication of this shift can be found in the attention lavished by both Pattison and Joakim Garff on Kierkegaard's conception of joy (Glæde) as presented in his 1849 discourses The Lily of the Field and the Birds of the Air. These discourses aim to have us learn from the Gospel's representatives of the natural world, the lily and the bird, "what it is to be a human being and what religiously is the requirement for being a human being," namely to live a life of "silence, obedience and joy."[1] Pattison and Garff both go out of their way to include a paragraph-long quote culminating in the realization that "the lily and the bird are joy, because silently and obediently they are entirely present to themselves in being today. (SKS 11: 42/WA: 39)" (57, 266). To my mind, this interest in the positive and even joyful side of Kierkegaard is a useful corrective to the traditional view of him as morbidly depressing or intractably vitriolic.

Some of the strongest essays are those that respond to Kierkegaard in a way that mirrors both his joyful wit and his intensely serious devotion to the most profound issues in life. Good examples are Edward Mooney's (on Kierkegaard's pseudonyms and style), Patrick Stokes' (on death), and Hugh Pyper's (on English language literature influenced by Kierkegaard). TheHandbook's qualities of inclusiveness and openness to differences are also clearly in keeping with this joyful spirit. But this very strength raises some critical issues. Some Kierkegaard scholars will undoubtedly worry that a Kierkegaard made happily amenable to a range of opposing approaches and readings loses his edge, that this ecumenical approach fits poorly with Kierkegaard's own fearsome pugnacity. Even if we insist that Kierkegaard's polemical fierceness towards his intellectual opponents need not be repeated in the relations among scholars of Kierkegaard, a deeper problem remains. It seems that the "big tent" approach on display in the volume is made possible in part by simply keeping opposing approaches and viewpoints separate from each other. At the very least, it can be said that not enough has been done to bring together the various strands of scholarship found in the book. The editors have structured it to interweave essays about theology, philosophy, and literature, yet much more could be done to explore the important connections among them. Similarly, more could be done to integrate treatment of topics that are overlapping; for example, the essays on Kierkegaard and the Danish Golden Age (Kirmmse), Romanticism (William McDonald), and German Idealism (Lore Hühn and Philipp Schwab). Likewise, more could be done to address the overlaps between the essays on Kierkegaard's own theology (Sylvia Walsh) and his relations to the history of theology (David Law), to the Church (Anders Holm), and to the Bible (Paul Martens).

A final general remark about the volume's likely influence concerns its responsiveness to extant Kierkegaard scholarship. Its publication was timed to coincide with the 200th anniversary of Kierkegaard's birth and the many commemorative Kierkegaard conferences held throughout the world in 2013. As the editors note in their introduction, it also auspiciously coincides with the completion of the new definitive edition of Kierkegaard's works, Søren Kierkegaards Skrifter (SKS), produced by the scholars at the Søren Kierkegaard Research Centre in Copenhagen. Calling attention to the completion of this project, Pattison and Lippitt claim that their "Handbook has been able to take full advantage of this most recent Kierkegaard scholarship" (7). What they do not mention here is the exactingly comprehensive, multi-volume and multi-tome series Kierkegaard Research: Sources, Readings and Reception (KRSRR), which is also a product of the Søren Kierkegaard Research Centre under the general editorship of Jon Stewart. Most of the contributors to this volume, including Pattison and Lippitt, were also contributors to KRSRR. The research in KRSRR informs and is cited by at least half of the essays in this volume, including the introduction by Pattison and Lippitt and their respective essays. KRSRR is generally considered the scholarly companion to SKS. That leaves this volume in a somewhat awkward position insofar as it also courts this companionship.

In this respect, the book is strongest when it builds on the research available in KRSRR while addressing topics that fall outside KRSRR's purview. Pattison's own contribution on Kierkegaard's relationship with the city of Copenhagen is a noteworthy example (discussed below). Equally valuable are contributions that build on the research in KRSRR while presenting a broader view than KRSRR's highly focused essays could provide. For example, a scholar interested in Kierkegaard's relations to Greek philosophy could consult Furtak's thorough but succinct essay on this topic -- or pour through the dozens of essays spanning the two tomes of the KRSRR devoted to "Kierkegaard and the Greek World." The Handbook's essays lack the exacting thoroughness of historical research that Jon Stewart demanded of  KRSRR contributions, and in this respect will be less helpful to scholars. On the other hand, the breadth of view afforded by many of the essays make it a valuable tool for scholars in other respects. That breadth nicely positions this volume to be a companion to both SKS and KRSRR.

The essays in the third section are perhaps most problematic in their relationship to KRSRR. This is in part because we find essays that have direct rivals in KRSRR, e.g., those on Kierkegaard's relationship to Nietzsche, Heidegger, and Wittgenstein. The awkwardness is increased by the fact that those essays include little or no mention of their parallels in KRSRR. (To a lesser extent this is also true of the passing treatment of others including Husserl, Deleuze, Derrida, Levinas, Marion, and MacIntyre, each with articles devoted to him in KRSRR.) These omissions are presumably due not to scholarly neglect but to the closely contiguous publication dates: the KRSRR volumes on these figures appeared in 2011 and 2012, apparently too late to be known or adequately addressed by this book's authors. Unfortunately these omissions make the book less well-informed and, in proportion, less helpful to future scholars than they otherwise could have been.

Having concluded my general remarks, I turn to a more detailed critical treatment of several essays. I will begin with an example of the problematic phenomenon just mentioned in Anthony Rudd's essay on Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein. Rudd begins with an extended comparison of Kierkegaard, Wittgenstein, and Kant. Broadening the already difficult comparison between Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein to include a comparison with Kant seems misguided at first, but Rudd puts it to good use toward the end of his essay. Rudd offers a nice synopsis of current debates on how to locate Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein in relation to one another and uses his comparison of Kant to argue for his own position. He suggests that understanding Wittgenstein "as a philosopher in the tradition of Kant and Kierkegaard" can help "free us from the assumption that his rejection of the idea that religious beliefs are quasi-scientific hypotheses must have committed him to some sort of expressivism (however subtle)" (498). Rudd makes use of the parallel, famously suggested by Stanley Cavell, between Wittgenstein's notion of different "language games" and Kierkegaard's notion of different "spheres" of values and meaning.

In making his case, Rudd draws on the same textual evidence that has been available to scholars of Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein for decades, namely the three explicit references to Kierkegaard in Wittgenstein's writings (in the notes published as Culture and Value) and a handful of references to Kierkegaard in letters or written accounts of Wittgenstein's conversations. The scarcity of these textual passages may be one of the reasons Rudd felt the need to bring Kant into his analysis. I suspect his textual case would have been much stronger had he taken into account the nine passages explicitly referencing Kierkegaard in a journal of Wittgenstein's that was only made public in 1997. These journals, known as the Koder diaries or the Denkbewegungen (Movements of Thought) journals, show the immense influence Kierkegaard had on Wittgenstein's thought in the time of transition between the Tractatus and thePhilosophical Investigations. Of particular interest to Rudd's case would be the many passages in which Wittgenstein explores the connections between his conception of different language games and the Kierkegaardian notion of different spheres of meaning, especially the religious sphere. In one passage mentioning Kierkegaard, Wittgenstein writes:

To be an apostle is a life. In part it surely expresses itself in what he says, but not in that it is true but in that he says it. Suffering for the idea defines him here, too, it holds that the meaning of the sentence 'this one is an apostle' lies in the mode of its verification. To describe an apostle is to describe a life.[2]

These newly discovered references to Kierkegaard are discussed in my essay on Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein in KRSRR, yet Rudd needn't have read that essay to know about them. They are also discussed by Genia Schönbaumsfeld in her book on Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein, which Rudd cites approvingly, and in Roe Fremstedal's "Wittgenstein and Kierkegaard on the Ethico-Religious" which Rudd does not cite.[3]

If the flaw in Rudd's essay is his thesis is more textually justified than he suggests, the opposite seems to be the case with Markus Kleinert's essay on Kierkegaard and Nietzsche. Kleinert references my essay in KRSRR as well as a host of other secondary sources. But his use of primary texts by Kierkegaard and Nietzsche is disappointingly narrow in scope, focusing almost entirely on their "self-presentations," Kierkegaard's in Point of View and Nietzsche's in Ecce Homo. Kleinert offers a brief review of some of the historical approaches to comparing these figures but keeps his own focus quite narrow, exploring how they each relate to the issue of divine providence in their self-understandings. He advances the thesis that "Kierkegaard and Nietzsche can help us to see more clearly how neither faith in providence, nor the abandonment of such faith, can be taken too lightly" (403). Even Kleinert seems to admit that this thesis is modest, indicating that this comparison "is intended to offer an original angle on a familiar comparison, no more and no less" (416). Given the myriad and profound ways we can compare and contrast Kierkegaard and Nietzsche and the widespread and enduring interest in comparing them (an interest Kleinert acknowledges), we might ask (paraphrasing Nietzsche): why so narrow and modest? It would seem more in keeping with the spirit otherwise present in the book to attempt a broader and more comprehensive overview of how Kierkegaard stands in relation to Nietzsche. The importance of this comparison is evidenced by the fact that many of the other essays mention, at least in passing, some aspect of Kierkegaard's relationship to Nietzsche; see, for example, the introduction by Pattison and Lippitt and the essays by Furtak, John Davenport, Merold Westphal, Clare Carlisle, Lee Barrett, and Leonardo Lisi. (In this respect the index is flawed, directing readers only to references to Nietzsche in the essays of Furtak, Davenport and Westphal, in addition to Kleinert.)

Adding to this problem of comprehensiveness is that, as Kleinert admits, "Nietzsche seems to be less preoccupied than is Kierkegaard by the theme of providence" (404). I think this is an understatement, or it escapes being an understatement only ironically in that neither thinker is as preoccupied with providence as Kleinert suggests. Although Kleinert makes a very insightful case for this idea's lingering presence in Ecce Homo, I doubt any Nietzsche scholar would list divine providence as one of the major themes of Nietzsche's corpus, or even one of the major themes in his critique of Christianity. It is even questionable whether Kierkegaard is centrally concerned with the issue of divine providence. Kleinert is right to qualify his claim that providence "is thematized in all periods and parts of Kierkegaard's authorship, that is, in the pseudonymous and in the signed books, in the journals and notebooks" with the admission that it is not always thematized "equally explicitly or intensely" (406). Despite its central role in The Point of View, I doubt many Kierkegaard scholars would list divine providence as one of the major themes in Kierkegaard's corpus as a whole. One would not expect an essay devoted to it in a book like this; it seems more one of the recurrent but narrower topics (like 'the absurd' or 'despair') that Pattison and Lippitt warn us not to take out of context, as discussed above.

In "Kierkegaard and Copenhagen," Pattison discusses the enormous influence the city of Copenhagen had on Kierkegaard. He traces the changes in Copenhagen in Kierkegaard's time as it struggled to become cosmopolitan, like Paris, rather than a market town, as Kierkegaard so often regarded it. In one example, Pattison discusses the feud between the cultural elitist J. L. Heiberg, head of the Royal Theater, and the cultural populist Georg Carstensen, founder of the amusement park Tivoli. Pattison reveals how Kierkegaard regarded them as two different manifestations of the same phenomenon in which human life loses its depth and is drained of any true qualitative distinctions or values, a process Kierkegaard called "leveling": "Both elitist and populist versions of urban modernity thus serve the cause of leveling . . . Both subordinate the individuality of the single, subjective, responsible human being to abstract and collective categories." (51)

It is striking, and perhaps ironic, that one of the most interesting parts of this essay on Copenhagen is the section "Other Places" in which Pattison describes the places Kierkegaard went to escape the "human swarm" of city life, especially after his ridicule in the tabloid newspaper The Corsair sullied his daily walks through the city. In particular, Pattison explores the church, the countryside and the graveyard, which Pattison quite elegantly sees as "signaling, respectively, the transcendence offered by religion, nature, and death" (53). His discussion of the countryside centers on the discourses on the lilies and birds discussed above. Pattison writes that the first of these discourses "contrasts the poetic attitude to nature and to the lilies and the birds with that of the Christian. The poet experiences nature as a beautiful and enchanting image of a freedom he longs for but which cannot be realized in the reality of the modern world" (57).

Pattison's otherwise moving account of the joy of the lily and bird is interrupted by a rather bizarre tangent comparing Kierkegaard's treatment of the poet to the account of the poet in the modern world offered by Walter Benjamin:

In a sense, the discourse condenses the argument of Benjamin's essays on Baudelaire as 'a lyric poet in the era of high capitalism', namely, that such a poet is fated to be impotent and marginal in relation to the concrete realities of society. If he has any political sympathies at all, it is with the terrorist, incapable of transforming society, and able only intermittently to disrupt it. (57)

To my mind this comparison runs the risk of eclipsing Kierkegaard's critique of the poet. It is not that the poet is unfortunately impotent to change society, as Benjamin's account seems to suggest. Kierkegaard is taking a poet severely to task for something blameworthy that the poet continues to do. For Kierkegaard, the poet despairingly avoids obeying the Gospel's call by understanding this call to be one of unattainable escapism: 'would that I could be a lily and bird and be free of my troubles, but alas . . . ' Ironically, the poet's wistful denial of the possibility of this escapism is itself another kind of escapism.

Furtak ("Kierkegaard and Greek Philosophy") traces several points of fundamental comparison between Kierkegaard and ancient Greek authors, especially Plato, Aristotle, and Epictetus. He does an excellent job of synthesizing Kierkegaard's many particular references and discussions of ancient Greek authors by doing fundamental comparisons of them. In particular he focuses on how they understand and pursue philosophy itself, as an existential and ethical undertaking rather than a merely conceptual and logical task. Furtak convincingly argues that because Kierkegaard takes these Greek authors as his model for how to do philosophy, we can shed light on Kierkegaard's works by understanding what these authors meant for him.

Furtak observes that Kierkegaard's model for existentialism was Greek, and especially Socratic, philosophy. In keeping with Pierre Hadot, he points to the idea of philosophy as a "life-view" and a way of living, as it was with the Stoics. He notes the connection between this mode of philosophy and the literary means of presenting it: "Kierkegaard, who portrays himself as a 'singular kind of poet and thinker' (SKS 12:28/WA: 165), revives the classical ideal of the literary philosopher, bringing individual life more emphatically into the orbit of philosophical writing." (135-36) Adding to these thoughts on the nature of philosophy and its relation to life, Furtak points out that Kierkegaard shares with these ancient authors a profound appreciation for how love, especially Romantic love, plays a role both in philosophy and living the best life. He gives an excellent discussion of the different Platonic conceptions of love (in the Symposiumand Phaedrus) and the shift regarding whether or not the person who is the original object of one's love remains an object of that love as he turns to what is (supposedly) higher and unchangeable, i.e., philosophical wisdom.

In "Pseudonyms and 'Style," Mooney delivers a masterful overview of Kierkegaard's use of pseudonyms, genres, and other literary tricks. His analysis of the problem of reading Kierkegaard and the question of what Kierkegaard's works aim to do (or in what sense they are even Kierkegaard's works) is profound and insightful. His writing is playful (for some readers, perhaps, too much so) but this seems quite appropriate for his subject matter. The organization of this piece into short meditations, almost aphorisms, is also highly conducive to what Mooney wants to address: the flurry of pseudonyms, personas, and voices that confront the reader of 'Kierkegaard'.

On the whole, Mooney's style and content is very reminiscent of the work of the late Louis Mackey: playful yet deeply profound, poetically moving yet dialectically rigorous. My one criticism is that at times Mooney overemphasizes this sense of a 'flurry' in Kierkegaard's works. In talking about selfhood, he asserts that Kierkegaard "continually intimates that only where radical openness to change is present -- that is, only where a solid self can't be pinned down -- can there be hope of real transfiguration" (201). This is true in an important sense; a self lacking possibility and fluidity is in despair. But the fluidity of selfhood can also be overemphasized. For example, The Sickness Unto Death presents the self as a balance of certain factors, including possibility and necessity, where overemphasis on either at the expense of the other constitutes a form of despair. More broadly still, Mooney makes it seem as if all of Kierkegaard's works leave us with a dizzying, carnivalesque feeling. This is often true, but it seems to me that some Kierkegaard works leave the reader instead with a sense of calm centeredness. As Mooney himself sometimes seems to suggest, what he says here is much more applicable to the pseudonymous works than to the other half of Kierkegaard's corpus.

The  last essay is Pyper's, but it might just as well have been the first. Pyper offers a wide-ranging and thoughtful account of Kierkegaard's influence on English literature. He suggests that "one of Kierkegaard's most significant literary legacies may be the identification of a particular character type: the reader of Kierkegaard." (571) Pyper considers why some people are drawn to be readers of Kierkegaard, noting that "The titles of his books themselves act as filters. Not every reader is going to be drawn to works entitled The Sickness Unto Death or Concluding Unscientific Postscript to the Philosophical Fragments." (571) He also notes how "Kierkegaard's name may have contributed to the attraction" with its "ø" and double "aa" and that "a certain elitist self-satisfaction is open to those who come to know that the final syllable did not rhyme with 'yard'" (571).

In one of the most intriguing parts of his analysis, Pyper (when discussing R. S. Thomas) notes:

From God, Kierkegaard learnt the art of anonymity, which leaves his readers groping for meaning just as they grope for meaning in reading God's world. The core metaphor of reading recurs here with the claim that to be a reader of Kierkegaard is a training in reading the world. (583)

I think this profound insight can be applied to all the book's contributors. They are all readers of Kierkegaard, passionately engaging with Kierkegaard in their own distinctive ways and with their own distinctive passions and interests. Each looks to read Kierkegaard's works in a way that not only opens the door to the meanings and lessons of these works, but, more importantly, opens the door to the world and life in powerful and enriching ways.

[1] SKS 11:7 / WA: 3. English translations of these discourses are published in the volume Without Authority, ed. Howard and Edna Hong, Princeton: Princeton University Press 1997, pp. 1-45.

[2] Ludwig Wittgenstein, Denkbewegungen, MS 183, p. 75; English translation: Ludwig Wittgenstein: Public and Private Occasions, ed. by James Klagge and Alfred Nordmann, trans. by Alfred Nordmann, New York: Rowman & Littlefield 2003, p. 83.

[3] Roe Fremstedal, “Wittgenstein and Kierkegaard on the Ethico-Religious,” Ideas in History, vol. 1, no. 2, 2006. Genia Schönbaumsfeld, A Confusion of the Spheres: Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein on Philosophy and Religion, Oxford: Oxford University Press 2007.