The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy and Neuroscience

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John Bickle (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy and Neuroscience, Oxford UP, 2009, 635pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195304787.

Reviewed by Gary Hatfield, University of Pennsylvania



This volume brings together twenty-four chapters in philosophy and neuroscience, spanning a gamut of topics from reduction and mechanistic explanation to the neurophilosophy of subjectivity. The primary philosophical authors sometimes have cross appointments in cognitive or neural science and sometimes team up with practicing scientists. As the editor explains in his brief introduction, he selected philosophical authors who had shown some engagement with actual neuroscience and imposed only two conditions on them: that they “make direct appeal to data and evidence from some recognized field of current neuroscience,” and that they “consider collaborating with a neuroscientist” (seven actually did) (p. 4). He did not provide topical constraints but asked his authors “to cover whatever they thought most interesting” (p. 5). The resulting volume is a survey of the interests of its authors, who sometimes provide context and framework for a specific issue in neuroscience and its philosophical connections and sometimes simply summarize their own recent work.

The editor chose the title Philosophy and Neuroscience in order to accommodate two somewhat different relations between philosophy and neuroscience. The majority of the essays are instances of what the editor describes as “philosophy of neuroscience,” that is, of “philosophical reflections on neuroscience’s emerging foundational questions” (p. 3). Philosophy of neuroscience is, in this regard, like philosophy of physics, chemistry, biology, psychology, or economics. It takes a living body of science as its starting point and addresses methodological, theoretical, and conceptual questions that arise from ongoing empirical and theoretical practice. This sort of philosophy of science goes back to the day when philosophers regularly engaged directly with science and contributed to its literature, that is, back to Aristotle, and it continues up through William James and C. L. Hardin and a host of present day practitioners, including many of the authors in this volume. The second type of approach covered by the title is “”SpellE">neurophilosophy," which, in the words of the editor, now stands for “the application of ”SpellE">neuroscientific discoveries to traditional philosophical concerns" (p. 4). The origin of this sort of philosophy depends on one’s perception of when “”SpellE">neuroscientific discoveries" first occurred, and so might go back to ancient theories of the senses in relation to knowledge, or to Descartes’ appeal to the phenomena of the phantom limb in his discussions of knowledge, or to Helmholtz’s epistemological writings that drew on his work in the physiology and psychology of color and spatial perception.

Within these categories, the first fourteen chapters fit into philosophy of neuroscience and the subsequent ten chapters count as neurophilosophy. The fourteen are loosely divided into four parts: explanation, reduction, and methodology; learning and memory; sensation and perception; and neurocomputation and neuroanatomy.

The chapters on reduction and methodology most strongly connect with recognized topics in the philosophy of science. William Bechtel’s chapter makes a good starting place, as it introduces a further distinction among brands of neuroscience and relates it to attitudes toward reduction. Specifically, Bechtel distinguishes between the majority of neuroscientists, who take a “cellular and molecular” approach, and a smaller group that focuses on “systems, behavioral, and cognitive neuroscience” (p. 13). He also identifies two groups of philosophers of neuroscience, who are reductionist but who align themselves with one or the other model of reduction according to their views of how reduction will play out. The “ruthless reductionists” foresee a direct reduction of mental function to cellular and molecular processes; they include the volume’s editor, Bickle. Members of the second group (more numerous in Bechtel’s estimation) are attracted to systems neuroscience as a framework within which to engage in a “mechanistic reduction” that relates systems and behavioral level description to a potential hierarchy of levels of analysis, eventually ending with cells and molecules (p. 14). By contrast, the ruthless reductionists (true to their origins in Quinean neurophilosophy) don’t believe that there are systematic results at the higher cognitive and behavioral levels to be reduced. Bechtel favors the systems view along with mechanical reduction via multiple levels, although he believes that, within the population of actual neuroscientists, this outlook is in the minority.

Sarah Robins and Carl Craver apply the ideas of mechanistic explanation to the phenomena of biological clocks. They focus on an allegedly new analysis of mechanisms in psychology and neuroscience. As they observe, the term “mechanism” in contemporary neuroscience does not connote a classical machine, or a “heroic simple” machine, or a machine “that works according to the principles of Newtonian mechanics” (p. 42). Rather, a mechanistic explanation invokes the organization and activities of constitutive parts in explaining how a process is carried out.

Here they simply reflect the common usage of the notion of “mechanism” in psychology, physiological psychology, cognitive science, and the philosophy of psychology, in which complex processing mechanisms came to be emphasized in the explanatory scheme during the 1960s, with possible physiological realization also envisioned. An early summary of the relevant scientific research, with appeal to “complex mechanisms” and their physiological realization, may be found in Peter Lindsay and Donald Norman’s Human Information Processing (New York: Academic, 1972). While complex systems had long been posited in the analysis of psychological capacities, going back to Descartes’ animal machines, philosophers were quick to pick up on these newly prominent conceptions in psychology, as did Jerry Fodor (1968), Robert Cummins (1975), and John Haugeland (1978).1 (Fodor of course futilely promoted the irrelevance of physiological mechanisms to his complex psychological mechanisms, but that does not take away from his invoking complex, decomposable, psychological mechanisms.) The chapter by Robins and Craver contributes a detailed analysis of a particular type of complex mechanism (a biological clock) that can be described at a functional level and ultimately related to neurophysiological mechanisms.

Alcino Silva and Bickle revive the idea of the scientific study of science, or what they term the “science of research” (p. 91). They focus on two “puzzles” about contemporary research. One is the “inefficiency” of “institutionalized science,” by which they mean the low number of citations accrued by most research articles. In a well-known citation index, only about half of articles with the keyword “cognition” received more than two citations, as did only about a third of those with keywords “learning” and “memory” (p. 94). (They don’t say whether they excluded newly published articles from these numbers.) The other is the “puzzle” of why multi-level reduction remains the goal in the philosophy of neuroscience, as opposed to Bickle’s conception of direct molecular reduction. The authors present a hypothesis, called the “convergent four,” to describe criteria that they claim are “jointly sufficient for fully establishing causal hypotheses in actual, current scientific research” (p. 100). The four are: observation; negative alteration (decreasing the magnitude of a putative causal factor); positive alteration; and integration (what Watson and Crick did for DNA, or Hebb for cell assemblies). They illustrate the four with a case study that speaks in favor of molecular and cellular reduction for memory consolidation, and they compare the four to previous proposed causal tests, such as J. S. Mill’s methods. Finally, they claim that low citation scores result from the fact that much research simply adds support to an already well-established relation that falls under one of the four; greater attention to the four allegedly would allow researchers to determine where new work needs to be done and thus generate novel research articles that garner higher scores on citation indices.

Anthony Chemero and Charles Heyser describe “object exploration” techniques used in research with rodents. From four empirical studies, they conclude that the relevant notion of an explorable object demands a “wide brain-body-environment system” (p. 86). They contend that such a system cannot be reduced, explanatorily or ontologically, to neuroscience; rather, neuroscience is only part of the picture and must be supplemented by environmentally embedded or “extended” cognitive systems.

The remaining articles on the philosophy of neuroscience take up specific problems or concepts in learning, perception, and neurocomputation. Colin Allen, James Grau, and Mary Meagher examine results that demonstrate spinal cord learning and that in some ways challenge the notion that higher cognitive concepts must be used to describe learning more generally. Alex Rosenberg contends that results from neurogenomics on memory consolidation in Aplysia (sea snail) and C. elegans (nematode worm) cast doubt on symbol-crunching models of cognitive representation by suggesting that actual neural mechanisms only probabilistically approach the clean syntax of such models. He concludes that without its vehicles, original and also derived intentionality must be jettisoned. Machamer in effect counters by showing that much neuroscience of learning is built on behaviorist models and contending that such models cannot explain how neural nodes in associationist nets gain content.

In the section on sensation and perception, Valerie Hardcastle and Matthew Stewart ask whether fMRI counts as a modern cerebroscope for detecting whether a person is actually in pain. They provide a brief tutorial on fMRI and speculate that use of the technique may lead to physical, as opposed to phenomenal, criteria for someone’s being in pain. Mazviita Chirimuuta and Ian Gold review results that tell against the notion of static receptive fields in the visual cortex, as associated with the names of Hubel and Wiesel, and in favor of a dynamic notion of receptive field that is tied to the environment. The other two chapters contain critiques of “enactive” sensorimotor conceptions of perception. Brian Keeley compares Aristotle, Johannes Müller, and Alva Noë on the relation between sense organs and sensory modalities, contending that the latter goes too far in detaching modality from organ. Charles Wallis and Wayne Wright maintain that extreme forms of enactivism are conceptually flawed and not well supported by the empirical research on which their claims purportedly are based. They remain sympathetic to less extreme urgings of the importance of action for perception.

The three articles on neurocomputation summarize results by their authors. Rick Grush presents his emulation theory of representation; Chris Eliasmith describes his neural engineering framework for theoretical or computational neuroscience; and Chris Cherniak reviews some results on neural wiring and computational complexity, connecting his findings with the anthropic principle in modern physics.

The subsequent two sections contain four chapters on aspects of neuroethics, namely motivation (Anthony Landreth), decision-making (Patricia Churchland), emergentism and the enhancement debate (Eric Racine and Judy Illes), and what’s new in neuroethics (Adina Roskies). These sections also include chapters on phantom limbs and other aspects of bodily perception (William Hirstein), delusional experience (Jennifer Mundale and Shaun Gallagher), and the use of animal models of emotion in analyzing neuropsychiatric disorders (Kenneth Sufka, Morgan Weldon, and Colin Allen).

In the final section, on neurophilosophy, Kenneth Aizawa and Carl Gillett examine massive multiple neural realization and its implications for reduction in the case of molecules in ocular photoreceptors. They argue that there is great variation in the realization of functions at all levels but that this does not argue against inter-level theoretic constraints and indeed is consistent with a co-evolutionary strategy for research across levels. Owen Flanagan reflects on the aftermath of his publishing an earlier article examining fMRI images of a meditating Buddhist monk’s brain. Pete Mandik discusses some of his Churchland-inspired work on consciousness and subjectivity, emphasizing that neural models, such as opponent-processing color systems, can yield novel predictions about qualitative experience.

The title of this volume, The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy and Neuroscience, invites reflection on the modern notion of the handbook. When Helmholtz published his Handbuch der physiologischen Optik (Leipzig: Voss, 1867) in the 1850s and 1860s, the standard for the Handbuch was clear: it should provide a comprehensive overview of the main findings and theoretical viewpoints in physiological optics, that is, in the scientific theory of vision. This should include a background section on ocular anatomy, and a thorough treatment of the main divisions of the subject: the dioptrics of the eye; the sensations of vision, including color vision; and the perceptions of vision as organized in space and as dependent on eye movements, binocular vision, and underlying psychological processes. There should be a comprehensive literature review and a description of the history of thought for each of the more particular topics within the broad divisions.

Such a comprehensive treatment soon was beyond the abilities of single individual, and the third edition of Helmholtz’s Handbuch was published by a committee, who provided addenda to Helmholtz’s original chapters and appendices on added topics. In 1934, Murchison published a Handbook of General Experimental Psychology (Worcester: Clark UP) that covered “”SpellE">adjustive" processes (motivation, emotion, and learning) and “receptive” processes (sense perception) in twenty individually authored chapters. These chapters surveyed the literature in roughly the first three decades of the twentieth century. In 1951, Stevens edited his Handbook of Experimental Psychology (New York: Wiley), which covered the main divisions of the subject, from physiological mechanisms to human performance, in thirty-six separately authored chapters. These surveyed the literature in roughly the two previous decades. Such handbooks provided advanced introductory treatments of a subject matter for upper-level students and for working professionals.

The present handbook does not aim for this sort of comprehensiveness, either in its treatment of topics or in its approach to the literature. For instance, the methodological chapters either focus on the debate over multi-level vs. ruthlessly molecular and cellular reduction or treat a specific experimental paradigm, object exploration. These topics are worthy of discussion and the case study on object exploration gets down to brass tacks. Still, one might have hoped for additional methodological questions to be addressed, including the logic of using fMRI to study systems-level functionally characterized processes, and a more general discussion of brain recording methods and their application. The logic of other methods in neuroscience, such as inferring normal function from brain-damage caused deficits, also would warrant discussion. Further, the very division between systems level neuroscience and cellular/molecular neuroscience might have been explored more fully in relation to various subject areas, including sense perception and emotion. Indeed, the lack of a section devoted to neuroscience and emotion is noteworthy. The editor tacitly justifies the lack of systematicity in the division of topics by explaining that “philosophy and neuroscience is a field that continues to define itself” (p. 5). In the end, the volume is more like a collection of the research of a selected set of authors than the construction of a handbook intended to survey a field. This characteristic shows up in the citations of most of the chapters. The chapters in philosophy of neuroscience cite few philosophical authors writing on neural specifics of the brain-mind relations except for themselves, Bickle, Bechtel, the Churchlands, and Craver. There is no attempt to provide an overview of the literature in philosophy and neuroscience, something that might have been deemed comparatively feasible in a young field.

It may be that, in relatively new fields, it takes more than one try to achieve an appropriate balance. Thus, when Louise Barrett, Robin Dunbar, and John Lycett published their 2002 textbook on Human Evolutionary Psychology (Princeton: Princeton UP), they in effect equated the field with the massively-modular, evolutionary-environment-of-adaptedness-evolutionary psychology (MMEEA-EP) approach that its originators (Tooby and Cosmides) believed should define that field. This had the effect of appropriating the name of a whole field for one theoretical position within the field.2 By the time Dunbar and Barrett edited The Oxford Handbook of Evolutionary Psychology (Oxford: Oxford UP, 2007), they apparently saw the need to take a more balanced stance, and they adopted Cecilia Heyes’s notion of an “evolutionary psychology in the round,”3 which went far beyond the emphasis on mating and attractiveness of the MMEEA-EP approach arising from social psychology and sociobiology, to engage the extant literature in the evolution of cognition and mind and to connect with evidence and theorizing from paleoanthropology, archaeology, geology, anthropological genetics, comparative psychology, and more.

More generally, it is surprising in a philosophical handbook not to find a chapter on the history of neuroscience and physiological approaches to psychology, in philosophical connection.4 Bechtel admirably endeavors to supply a small portion of this history, but as this occurs in the midst of his systematic attention to other issues it is necessarily sketchy. In Bechthel’s accounting, molecular and cellular neuroscience begins about 1962 through the work of Frank Schmitt. Systems neuroscience emerges from brain physiology going back to the nineteenth century, behavioral neuroscience takes up the torch from physiological psychology in the 1980s, and cognitive neuroscience arises in the late 1980s. Taking the early part of Bechtel’s focal period, other events would have been worthy of note, including the founding of an interdisciplinary Institute of Neurological Sciences in 1953 at the University of Pennsylvania, Roger Sperry’s appointment as Professor of Psychobiology at Cal Tech in 1954, and the publication in 1958 of papers from an interdisciplinary seminar bringing together “anatomy, physiology, biochemistry, and behavior” at Wisconsin in the 1950s, as well as the ocurrence of other nationally organized seminars studying the relation between the biological and biochemical sciences and mental health (including normal mental processes).5 Psychobiology, psychophysiology, and physiological psychology were terms invented in the nineteenth century and which named approaches that were taken throughout the twentieth century. These approaches are part of the history of what are now called the neurosciences, and that history should include figures such as Karl Lashley, Frank Beach, Harry Harlow, and Karl Pribram (to name only a few of those active in the middle third of the twentieth century). Assuming, of course, that the history of neuroscience is not to be defined as the history of scientists who called themselves neuroscientists.

The volume is to be commended for collecting chapters that address issues of reduction, intentional eliminativism, enactivism, and the extended mind, as well as several nuts-and-bolts case studies in the practice of neuroscience. Depending on one’s specific interests, there is more or less to find. It is a good starting place especially for those interested in current controversies in the neuroscientific reduction of memory consolidation.

1 Jerry Fodor, Psychological Explanation (New York: Random, 1968), esp. ch. 3; Robert Cummins, “Functional Analysis,” Journal of Philosophy 72 (1975): 741-64; John Haugeland, “The Nature and Plausibility of ”SpellE">Cognitivism," Behaviorial and Brain Sciences 1 (1978): 215-26.

2 A similar manipulation of names occurs in the present volume, when psychophysics is said to be “a ”SpellE">subdiscipline of visual neuroscience" (p. 205). Presumably, in this scheme, psychology and cognitive science are to be reckoned as subdisciplines of neuroscience more generally.

3 Cecilia Heyes, “Evolutionary Psychology in the Round,” in The Evolution of Cognition, ed. Cecilia Heyes and Ludwig Huber (Cambridge: MIT Press, 2000), 3-22.

4 In his introduction, Bickle dates the beginning of the philosophy of neuroscience to P. S. Churchland’s Neurophilosophy (Cambridge: MIT Press, 1986), stating that this work “codified certain fundamentals,” such as a focus on theories “in psychology and the neurosciences” (p. 3). In fact, Churchland’s work is noteworthy for its lack of attention to actual theories in scientific (as opposed to a mythical “folk”) psychology and for its mischaracterization of the theories on memory that it does discuss, on which see Hatfield, “What Can the Mind Tell Us About the Brain? Psychology, Neurophysiology, and Constraint,” in Perception and Cognition: Essays in the Philosophy of Psychology (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2009), 429-50. More generally, philosophical authors informed on neurophysiology and psychology predate Churchland.

5 Harry F. Harlow and Clinton N. Woolsey (eds.), Biological and Biochemical Bases of Behavior (Madison: U. of Wisconsin Press, 1958), jacket cover and preface.