The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Education

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Harvey Siegel (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Education, Oxford UP, 2009, 548pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195312881.

Reviewed by Peter J. Markie, University of Missouri



The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Education is advertised as having a complex purpose: to provide readers with a general introduction to key issues in the field, to advance the philosophical discussion of those issues, and to bring the philosophy of education back into closer contact with general philosophy. There’s a strong revivalist hope here. Siegel points out in his introductory essay that, from the 1950’s through 1970’s, major philosophers with established reputations in other areas made significant contributions to the philosophy of education, but such contributions have been rare in the last three decades. As he sees it, “the time is right for philosophy of education to regain its rightful place in the world of general philosophy”, and this collection is intended as a major step in that direction (p. 7). It is intended to help end “the benign neglect of philosophy of education by the general philosophical community” (p. 5). Toward that end, its twenty-eight essays are authored by philosophers with established reputations in epistemology, ethics, the philosophy of science and the history of philosophy, as well as specialists in the philosophy of education. The essays are grouped into six sections: The Aims of Education; Thinking, Reasoning, Teaching and Learning; Moral Value and Character Education; Knowledge, Curriculum and Educational Research; Social and Political Issues; and Approaches to Philosophy of Education and Philosophy.

As a general introduction to the field, the collection has notable strengths. The essays cover a wide range of interesting topics from a variety of philosophical perspectives. They are uniformly well-written and accessible to readers without a prior background in the philosophy of education. The collection contains little, however, to help readers appreciate the general nature and structure of current debates in the philosophy of education. Those looking for a “handbook” in the sense of an overview that defines the main issues in the field, explains their relations to one another and to issues in other areas of philosophy, and presents the main competing theories on those issues will be somewhat disappointed.

As a collection of papers likely to advance research in the philosophy of education, the collection contains many essays that directly take on issues in the area and make important contributions to on-going debates. In several cases, excellent essays from different parts of the collection play off of one another in important ways. Nonetheless, the collection also contains several essays that present interesting results from other areas of philosophy but make only a passing attempt to relate them to the philosophy of education. Others make interesting points in the philosophy of education, but it is unclear just how those points advance any wider discussion.

As a display of the intimate connections between the philosophy of education and other areas of philosophy, the collection is again uneven. Some notable successes bring results from other areas of philosophy directly to bear on issues in the philosophy of education, but some notable failures, as already noted, seem to make only a passing attempt to do so.

In all, the collection of essays is a bit uneven in a way that may go back to a tension between the components of its complex purpose. Insofar as a collection of essays is intended to introduce readers to the general issues and debates in the philosophy of education, while making substantive contributions to those debates, the essays will ideally be written by experts in the philosophy of education. Insofar as the collection is also intended to display the connection between the philosophy of education and other areas of philosophy, the essays will ideally be written by philosophers who couple their expertise in the philosophy of education with a specialization in those other areas as well. Insofar as the collection is intended to counter a thirty-year trend in which experts in other areas of philosophy have ignored the philosophy of education, it will be very hard to find such a group of philosophers.

The collection has many notable highlights, however, and they outshine its deficiencies. The first section of the collection, devoted to the aims of education, contains fine essays by Emily Robertson and Harry Bridgehouse. In “Moral and Political Aims of Education”, Bridgehouse provides an excellent survey of different positions on three topics: the proper goals of education based on a conception of an educated person, the appropriate distribution of educational opportunities, and the appropriate limits on government action to advance those goals and distribute those opportunities. His account of both parent- and child- centered constraints and the associated trade-offs between educational and other social values is particularly insightful. Robertson’s discussion in “The Epistemic Aims of Education” concerns the epistemic aims of education in terms of knowledge, justified belief and understanding, and the proper role of testimony in advancing those aims. It should be read in conjunction with David Carr’s contribution in the fourth section, “Curriculum and the Value of Knowledge”. Carr surveys past and present answers to the question of what should be taught and why, and traces a movement away from the epistemic dimension of the curriculum, considered by Robertson, to political concerns.

The third essay in the aims of education section is Martha Nussbaum’s “Tagore, Dewey and the Imminent Demise of Liberal Education”. She claims that citizenship in a pluralistic democratic society requires the capacity for Socratic self-criticism, the ability to see oneself as a member of a heterogeneous nation and world, and a narrative imagination that enables one to put oneself in another’s place. Education in art and the humanities is crucial to the development of these abilities, according to Nussbaum, but that education is “on the ropes” in universities outside the United States and in K through 12 education everywhere. Nussbaum does not consider the relative importance of other abilities, e.g. economic and scientific literacy, to democratic citizenship, and the reasons for the neglect of art and the humanities get little attention from her, beyond passing references to a preoccupation with economic success. This last issue is addressed in an excellent essay by Philip Kitcher in the fourth section of the collection, however. In “Education, Democracy and Capitalism”, he considers the relation between John Dewey’s view of education and Adam Smith’s economic analysis and finds that the latter poses a threat to the former: “societies that invest in systems of education that aim at Dewey’s preferred goals will lose out in economic competition to societies that adopt more efficient systems of education” (p. 308). Kitcher suggests a response on Dewey’s behalf. He would have us “change economic conditions so that democracy and Deweyan education both become possible” (p. 314). Kitcher does not indicate how this economic change is to be accomplished, especially in the current global economy.

The second section contains a series of diverse essays grouped under the broad heading of “Thinking, Reasoning, Teaching and Learning”. A notable entry here is Richard Feldman’s “Thinking, Reasoning and Education”. He presents three points that are important to the development of students’ thinking and reasoning skills: they must come to see arguments as a tool for increased understanding, they must come to see moral claims as objective and so as proper objects of reasoning, and they need not learn the traditional informal fallacies. Feldman’s essay is especially worth considering in conjunction with Amélie Rorty’s essay, “Educating the Practical Imagination: A Prolegomenon”, from the same section. Where Feldman emphasizes the need for students to see normative claims as objective if they are to engage well in practical reasoning, Rorty adds that imaginative thinking is also an essential ingredient within practical reasoning and considers how strategies for imaginative thinking can best be taught. Also notable in this second section of the anthology is Eamonn Callan and Dylan Arena’s essay, “Indoctrination”. They present a careful analysis of indoctrination in terms of close-minded belief, explain the moral failing indoctrination involves and address the Platonic challenge regarding the potential benefits of indoctrination, especially for those with limited cognitive skills.

In the third section (on moral, value and character education) Graham Oddie, in “Values Education”, presents the fundamental question that needs to be addressed: What values are to be taught, in what context and how? He argues, with regard to the question of how, that students need to be presented with more than moral principles and supporting arguments; they need to be presented with values experiences to promote the refinement of their emotions. Michael Slote continues this theme, arguing in “Caring, Empathy and Moral Education” for the importance of empathy for an ethics of care and considering how it can best be developed in students.

The collection’s fourth section, on knowledge, curriculum and educational research, contains the already noted essays by Carr and Kitcher. It also contains a careful discussion by Robert Audi on how the value of religious toleration and a liberal neutrality toward the good should play out in the design of science education. Audi’s essay is a fine example of how the methods of philosophical analysis can be brought to bear on a complicated and often confused debate.

The highlight of the fifth section, which is devoted to social and political issues, and one of the best essays in the collection, is Meira Levinson’s “Mapping of Multicultural Education”. Carefully examining the views of various philosophers, educational theorists and education practitioners, she shows how the notion of multicultural education is muddled and self-contradictory. While reaffirming many of the values that are attached to calls for multicultural education, she shows that those values “neither derive from nor are clarified by the concept” of multicultural education itself (p. 428). She properly warns us that the use of the term ‘multicultural education’ “as an umbrella term that fosters warm and fuzzy feelings of unity (at least among certain groups) shouldn’t be confused with its theoretical coherence, of which there is little to none” (p. 446).

In the last section, Randall Curren and Nicholas Burbles provide careful discussions of the particular implications, if any, of pragmatism and postmodernism, respectively, for the philosophy of education. Nell Noddings surveys the history of feminist philosophy in terms of three centers of concentration and ends with some quite brief remarks about their relation to philosophy of education.