The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Mathematics and Logic

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Stewart Shapiro (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Mathematics and Logic, Oxford University Press, 2005, 856pp, $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195148770.

Reviewed by JC Beall, University of Connecticut


You don't have to love numbers or 'formal stuff' in order to love this book. Loving philosophy is sufficient, and, besides, there is a great deal more to philosophy of mathematics and logic than numbers and formal stuff.

Mathematics and logic pervade the history of philosophy, both as tools and subject matter. The philosophy of mathematics and logic, perhaps contrary to popular impression, is driven by core philosophical topics -- matters of metaphysics, epistemology, language, and, to some extent, even mind. This is no surprise. Philosophy proceeds only by way of argument, and inasmuch as logic concerns itself with 'good arguments', the discipline is conspicuously central. Mathematics, on the other hand, might not be as conspicuously central to philosophy as logic (maybe), but, if nothing else, it is a wonderful phenomenon for cutting one's philosophical teeth -- or wearing them out, if one wishes. Brief reflection on even the elementary areas of mathematics raises core questions in metaphysics (e.g., what are mathematical objects?), epistemology (e.g., how on earth do we know mathematical truths?), and related, overlapping issues in language (e.g., how to characterize mathematical truth) and mind (e.g., beliefs about mathematical objects) -- not to mention philosophical issues concerning science in general.

If I were introducing someone to 'core, analytic philosophy', I would send them to the philosophy of mathematics and logic -- or, at least, I would like to, if a suitably accessible guide were available. As it turns out, there is now such a guide: Shapiro's Handbook does the trick.

In the flood of recent 'handbooks', 'guides', and the like, one is rightly suspicious of another 'handbook of such and so'. In the current case, suspicions should be put aside. The Oxford Handbook of the Philosophy of Mathematics and Logic is a very accessible, wide ranging work that serves not only to indicate the 'state of the art' in the given area, but, remarkably, also serves as a very fine introduction to the field. I recommend it highly, both to workers in the given field and, equally, to the 'general philosopher', regardless of one's main area.

In what follows, I will avoid taking issue with particular essays (since it would be awkward to highlight some but not others), and instead simply sketch the main topics and chapters.

General Structure

The volume begins with a very useful and equally user-friendly sketch of the target field(s). (The two fields -- philosophy of mathematics, and of logic -- are very closely related, but distinguishable; the introductory essay, and the remaining chapters themselves, nicely illustrate the relation.) In turn, there are some historical chapters that, while independently interesting, serve to set the stage for contemporary debates, debates that are well represented in subsequent chapters. Three of the best known positions in philosophy of mathematics are logicism, formalism, and intuitionism, positions that dominated the field in the early twentieth century -- the 'big three', as Shapiro calls them. Following the historical chapters, mentioned above, are a handful of chapters treating each of the 'big three'. For each such position, there is (for the most part) a sympathetic chapter and a critical chapter (these being flagged by titles with the word 'reconsidered'). After the 'big three' come chapters that represent late twentieth-century positions, with (for the most part) both critical and sympathetic discussions. After a very informative (and quite sympathetic) chapter on so-called predicative approaches in philosophy and foundations of mathematics, and a general chapter on the issue of applying mathematics, the last part of the book contains sections on conspicuously logical topics, topics and debates squarely in the philosophy of logic (but, of course, nonetheless relevant to philosophy of mathematics).

The general structure, as above, is well conceived, and lends itself to a first step into the target fields, as well as affording, as I mentioned, a reasonable view of the current 'state of the art'. The structure is perhaps easier to appreciate by a quick glance at the individual chapters, which I will here break up into sections (even though the book doesn't use these section-titles).

Section Zero: Broad Background

Stewart Shapiro. 'Philosophy of Mathematics and Its Logic: Introduction'. This essay is a broad but informative sketch of the target fields. The essay nicely sketches the topics and their respective places in the field, and it serves as a sufficient background to the subsequent chapters.

Section One: Historical Background

Lisa Shabel. 'Apriority and Application: Philosophy of Mathematics in the Modern Period'. This essay discusses Kant's relevant views, and the views of his predecessors.

John Skorupski. 'Later Empiricism and Logical Positivism'. This essay lays out the influence of later empiricism on the target fields, and discusses the impact and ideas of John Stuart Mill and the logical positivists.

Juliet Floyd. 'Wittgenstein on Philosophy of Logic and Mathematics'. Like the other chapters in this section and their target figures, Floyd's essay nicely sketches the content and history of Wittgenstein's thought, as well as the ongoing impact that surfaces in different interpretations -- for example, inconsistency approaches to truth, and so on.

Section Two: The Big Three

Subsection One: Logicism and Neologicism

William Demopoulos and Peter Clark. 'The Logicism of Frege, Dedekind, and Russell'. This is an excellent introduction to the so-called logicist program. The chapter sketches both the historical roots and ideas of the program as found in Frege, Dedekind, and Russell.

Bob Hale and Crispin Wright. 'Logicism in the Twenty-first Century'. Here we meet so-called neologicism, the contemporary offspring of the 'old' logicism (discussed in the previous chapter). This essay nicely lays out the apparent need to go 'neo' and the subsequent routes towards achieving the (neo-) logicist's aims.

Agust’n Rayo. 'Logicism Reconsidered'. This essay focuses on the neologicist project and provides a (technical) assessment of where the program stands today. While it is slightly more technical than some of the others, the essay is nonetheless very user-friendly, with each technical notion being clearly defined.[1]

Subsection Two: Formalism

Michael Detlefsen. 'Formalism'. This is the only chapter that focuses entirely on formalism, but the length, breadth, and clarity of the chapter make additional chapters unnecessary. If you want an introduction to the historical, philosophical, and logical aspects of formalism, you would do well to start here.

Subsection Three: Intuitionism

Carl Posy. 'Intuitionism and Philosophy'. This chapter chiefly (but not exclusively) focuses on the philosophical side of intuitionism, both the history and content, but (of course) also sketches so-called intuitionistic logic.

D. C. McCarty. 'Intuitionism in Mathematics'. This chapter is a nice follow-up to the previous one; it gets into the mathematical side of intuitionism -- what the mathematical issues are, and so on.

Roy Cook. 'Intuitionism Reconsidered'. This chapter focuses squarely on the logical (as opposed to distinctly mathematical) aspects of intuitionism. In particular, various technical issues confronting 'intuitionistic logic' are discussed in a very clear, user-friendly fashion.

Section Three: Twentieth-Century Backdrop

Michael D. Resnik. 'Quine and the Web of Belief'. This chapter focuses on the familiar but philosophically influential Quinean holism, discussing its import and impact in the philosophy of mathematics and logic. The chapter is particularly helpful in its formulations of holism and Quine's so-called indispensability argument.

Penelope Maddy. 'Three Forms of Naturalism'. This chapter, as its title suggests, distinguishes three forms of naturalism, with particular attention to various prominent 'naturalistic' principles and their respective bearing on mathematics or logic.

Alan Weir. 'Naturalism Reconsidered'. This chapter 'reconsiders' the main threads of naturalism, where 'reconsiders' mostly means 'very critically discusses'.

Section Four: Twentieth-Century Positions

Subsection One: Nominalism

Charles Chihara. 'Nominalism'. This chapter discusses one of the twentieth century's more popular positions, namely, nominalism. The chapter critically discusses a few varieties of nominalism, and briefly argues for a particular brand.

Gideon Rosen and John P. Burgess. 'Nominalism Reconsidered'. As with other chapters that 'reconsider' matters, this chapter offers a forceful critique, in this case, a critique of nominalism in general.

Subsection Two: Stucturalism

Geoffrey Hellman. 'Structuralism'. This chapter discusses an increasingly popular position. It treats variations of structuralism, focusing on one with which the author is sympathetic.

Fraser MacBride. 'Structuralism Reconsidered'. This chapter offers a balanced and informative discussion of the main issues confronting the viability of structuralism (or, at least, some versions of it).

Section Five: Foundations and Applications

Solomon Feferman. 'Predicativity'. This is a very useful discussion of so-called predicative approaches, both in philosophy and mathematics. Details of predicative approaches, and their virtues, are laid out.

Mark Steiner. 'Mathematics -- Application and Applicability'. Various senses of 'applying mathematics' are distinguished and, in turn, applied to the fundamental issue concerning the application of mathematics in science.

Section Six: Logic, Logic, and More Logic

Stewart Shapiro. 'Logical Consequence, Proof Theory, and Model Theory'. This chapter is a useful review of the areas given in the title; it emphasizes the importance of semantic notions in model theory.

Dag Prawitz. 'Logical Consequence From a Constructivist Point of View'. This chapter is a very good follow-up to its immediate predecessor; it nicely illustrates the 'constructivist' perspective of consequence, which naturally leads to proof theory.

Neil Tennant. 'Relevance in Reasoning'. This chapter represents a flavor of so-called 'relevance logic' (or 'relevant logic', if you are in Australasia), arguing that logical consequence, properly understood, demands features of 'relevance' (e.g., that premises be 'relevant' to conclusions).

John P. Burgess. 'No Requirement of Relevance'. This chapter could aptly be called 'Relevance Reconsidered', in keeping with other so-named chapters. The chapter is a sustained, critical discussion of relevance logic, with its chief conclusion reflected in the chapter's title.

Stewart Shapiro. 'Higher-order Logic'. This is an excellent introductory sketch of so-called higher-order logic and (some of) its applications.

Ignacio JanŽ. 'Higher-order Logic Reconsidered'. This chapter 'reconsiders' (i.e., critically evaluates) standard, second-order logic, arguing that it ultimately violates key requirements of logical consequence.

Closing Remarks

My overall evaluation, as above, is that this is a very welcome volume. My hope is that it will be welcomed by philosophers beyond the 'numbers and formal stuff' circles. My prediction is that it will be so welcomed.

[1] I should note that, in general, this virtue of user-friendliness is common to all of the 'more technical' chapters. This is a fine achievement by the contributors and the editor.