The Oxford Handbook of Plato

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Gail Fine (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Plato, Oxford University Press, 2008, 604pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195182903.

Reviewed by Noburu Notomi, Keio University, Japan


The Oxford Handbook of Plato (OHP) contains twenty-two articles of substantial length (from 20 to 30 pages). Short footnotes and a bibliography accompany each chapter, and another concise bibliography and indices (locorum, nominum, subject) are added at the end of the volume. Readers may perhaps be overwhelmed by this huge volume of over 600 pages. The book is not to be used as an encyclopedia or dictionary. But it evokes new ideas and challenges to readers of Plato who, like its contributors, work in the analytic style. Each chapter guides readers to a particular topic or phase of Plato's philosophy, but each is, more or less, an independent contribution. Cross-references between the chapters are rare.

Apart from the Introduction (ch.1), by the editor, the twenty-one contributions can be grouped into four categories: general background (chs.2-4), philosophical topics (chs.5-14), specific dialogues (chs.15-20), and legacies or receptions (chs.21-22). The combination of these different categories is one of the salient features of OHP that differentiate it from other similar volumes. For example, A Companion to Plato, edited by H. Benson (Blackwell 2006), is clearly intended as a topic-oriented guide (with 29 chapters); a similar arrangement is adopted in The Cambridge Companion to Plato, edited by R. Kraut (CUP 1992), which, however, has chapters that mix specific topics and some individual dialogues (Men., Rep., Soph., Phlb.). The editor indicates in her Introduction to this volume a clear policy of multiple approaches to particular dialogues or topics (pp.4-5). This policy certainly succeeds in enriching our understanding of Plato's philosophy. If readers find it difficult to move across the chapters, they are advised to consult the editor's Introduction first, which nicely summarizes the main points of each chapter. The Introduction is, however, not a mere summary of the following chapters, but also connects them together, in a way that presents the editor's own view of Plato's philosophy.

In the first part, after the Introduction, M. Schofield (ch.2 "Plato in His Time and Place") places Plato's position in historical (in particular, political and intellectual) context. This chapter provides a good overview of several central topics that appear in the following chapters: preceding thinkers, rhetoric, politics, and Plato's writings and views on education. One of the features of this chapter is to minimize the importance of biographical information about Plato, ordinarily supplied from Ep.VII, the authenticity of which Schofield doubts; more discussion is given in his Plato, OUP 2006).

T.H. Irwin (ch.3 "The Platonic Corpus") describes the corpus and text of Plato. He gives an introductory explanation of the Platonic texts (transmission, manuscripts, and modern editions), and defends the "standard chronology" of Plato's dialogues, which several other contributors (notably Matthews and Devereux) retain, although it has come under fire in recent scholarship, as noted on pp.77-84 (cf. p.6). I find the explanation of the textual criticism simplistic, and the evaluation of the most recent editions somewhat misleading: Irwin ignores the large difference between the new OCT Volume I (containing the first two tetralogies, 1995), which includes more "conjectures" than the old OCT by J. Burnet, and the new OCT Republic by S. Slings (2003), which is far more conservative in returning to the major manuscripts. As for the latter, it is regrettable that the stereotyped criticism of a single editorial proposal at Rep. 511d (p.74), although such emendations are in fact quite rare in Slings, gives a negative impression that questions the historic significance of the whole edition.

M.M. McCabe's chapter (ch.4 "Plato's Ways of Writing") presents a philosophical treatment of Plato's way of "writing dialogues." It can be read together with the previous two introductory chapters of general background, although the editor classifies this chapter under "central themes in Plato's work" (p.3). McCabe advocates the importance of the dramatic frame of the dialogues, which reflects the vast attention paid to this subject in recent studies of Plato. Her basic idea of considering the dramatic setting and characters is shared by Meinwald on Phlb. (ch.20, pp.485-7) but not by others,who are more typical of the analytic reading of Plato. On the other hand, those who are not familiar with the dialogues may find this chapter hard to follow because of the many brief references to particular passages in diverse dialogues.

The second part starts with two chapters on Socrates. G.B. Matthews (ch.5 "The Epistemology and Metaphysics of Socrates") discusses, under this challenging title, the meaning of Socrates' disavowal of knowledge, by examining various scholarly views on the method of elenchus, while avoiding committing himself on the problem of the "historical Socrates." His "aporetic" reading of Socrates' epistemology differs from the proposal of Taylor (ch.7), although they share the strategy of distinguishing two kinds of knowledge (latent/manifest) to solve the difficulties raised in Men. D. Devereux (ch.6 "Socratic Ethics and Moral Psychology") separately treats the ethics and moral psychology of Socrates. Both chapters more or less retain the "standard" distinction between Socrates (the earlier dialogues) and Plato (the middle and later dialogues), although the relation between the two philosophers (or two stages) is regarded as more complex and more controversial among recent Plato scholars (especially outside the Anglophone analytic tradition).

Then, eight chapters on particular aspects of Plato's philosophy follow in the second part: C.C.W. Taylor (ch.7 "Plato's Epistemology"), V. Harte (ch.8 "Plato's Metaphysics"), P. Crivelli (ch.9 "Plato's Philosophy of Language"), H. Lorenz (ch.10 "Plato on the Soul"), J. Annas (ch.11 "Plato's Ethics"), R. Kraut (ch.12 "Plato on Love"), C. Bobonich (ch.13 "Plato's Politics"), and R. Kamtekar (ch.14 "Plato on Education and Art"). These chapters cover most of the central topics of Plato. Although there are a few missing topics, e.g. mathematics and god, the selection looks reasonable and sufficient. Some chapters are more orthodox than others. Taylor, for instance, discusses epistemology in the standard manner, by moving from Socrates to the four main dialogues about knowledge, Men., Phd., Rep., and Tht. successively. Harte, on the other hand, develops an original argument that is very careful to avoid commitment on the traditional issue of the "development" of Plato's thought. By putting forward several key questions and trying to answer them, she tries to discuss the theory of Forms in a philosophically satisfying manner. This challenging attempt renews the philosophical interest in Plato's "Forms." The authors of this part often focus on particular dialogues in discussing the topics: Crivelli mainly on Crat. and Soph., Lorenz on Prot., Gorg., Phd., and Rep., Kraut mainly on Symp., and Bobonich on Phd., Rep., Plt., and Lg. (a natural selection on politics, apart from the interesting inclusion of Phd.). In so doing, they often ignore the difference in the contexts of the various dialogues.

The third part deals with six particular dialogues: D. Scott on Rep. (ch.15 "The Republic"), S. Peterson on Parm. (ch.16 "The Parmenides"), M.-K. Lee on Tht. (ch.17 "The Theaetetus"), L. Brown on Soph. (ch.18 "The Sophist on Statements, Predication, and Falsehood"), T.K. Johansen on Ti. (ch.19 "The Timaeus on the Principles of Cosmology"), and C.C. Meinwald on Phlb. (ch.20 "The Philebus"). As noted in the Introduction (p.4), this is the editor's selection, which represents a recent trend of Platonic studies. Apart from Rep., which is generally agreed to be central to Plato's philosophy, the other five dialogues are all located in relatively later stages of Plato's thought, which have been much focused on for the last few decades (or even since Vlastos raised the issue of the TMA and Owen proposed the (re-) placement of the Timaeus in the 1950s). On the other hand, OHP shows that academic interests have shifted in the analytic tradition from what they were in the late 20th century. For example, when Johansen discusses the "principles of cosmology" as the main theme of Tim., he no longer concerns himself with the place of this dialogue in the development of the theory of Forms, while this issue was central to Owen, Cherniss, and many others. Peterson gives a delicate analysis of the arguments of the notoriously difficult Parm., whereas much of the previous treatment was dedicated to very limited sections of the dialogue, namely the two versions of the so-called TMA. Also, Brown treats the difficult dialogue, Soph., from a slightly different angle. Instead of dealing directly with the traditional issue of whether, and how, Plato distinguishes different uses of the verb "is" (cf. Ackrill, Owen, Bostock, et al.), she suggests that the central problem is how to speak correctly. Likewise, Lee provides a fresh treatment of the much studied Tht., and Meinwald tries to locate in the context of the later dialogues the argument of the complex Phlb., which has been getting more scholarly attention in recent years. Thus, this part clearly shows that recent studies of Plato are seeking a new direction of reading the later dialogues, putting them in a wider perspective and being more faithful to the texts.

Finally, the fourth part contains two chapters on the legacy and reception of Plato's philosophy in antiquity. C. Shields (ch.21 "Plato and Aristotle in the Academy") examines Aristotle's reaction to Plato's philosophy, and in particular is concerned with the possibility of understanding the latter in the light of the former. While its title includes "the Academy," Shields does not treat the context of dialectic debates among the philosophers of the Old Academy, e.g. Speusippus, Xenocrates, and Philip of Opus (strangely, the author does not even refer to John Dillon's The Heirs of Plato, OUP 2005). In the final chapter, C. Brittain (ch.22 "Plato and Platonism") clearly and concisely discusses the essence of the Platonic tradition, especially Neoplatonism: what the ancient Platonists inherited from Plato's philosophy and how they differed from him. Brittain's excellent guide shows the possibility of fruitful collaboration between historical and philosophical research of the Platonic tradition (which is becoming more popular) and the understanding of Plato's philosophy in its own right.

The most striking feature of OHP is its representation of current interests and achievements of Platonic studies in the Anglophone analytic tradition. Contrast it, for example, with A Companion to Ancient Philosophy, eds. M.L. Gill & P. Pellegrin (Blackwell 2006), which provides wider perspectives. While OHP presents the clear and instructive arguments typical of its tradition, attention to philology and history is generally weak. Although the analytic approach is no longer as monolithic or as dominant as it used to be, this handbook can be seen as suggesting the direction in which analytic arguments are heading.

OHP as a whole pays little attention to other traditions, e.g. literary, hermeneutical, Tübingen, Straussian, and Continental. McCabe is the only author who mentions Derrida, Tübingen scholars, and Leo Strauss in her brief footnotes, but she quickly dismisses them (p.98). In this sense, the volume looks more like a monologue than like the dialogues among different philosophers that Plato depicts between Socrates and his interlocutors, including the formidable sophists. Indeed there are only a very small number of references to academic works outside Anglo-American scholarship; in particular the end Bibliography includes few works (even including translations of Plato) written in languages other than English. Non-Anglophone Platonic studies have been showing much progress, but surprisingly the monumental new translation and commentary on Rep. by M. Vegetti and his team (La Repubblica I-VII, Bibliopolis 1998-2007), for instance, is not mentioned in OHP. Even if student readers might not immediately consult works written in French, German, or Italian, I firmly believe that a handbook like this should at least contain basic bibliographical information about the most important works of other traditions and languages, to provide a balanced view of current scholarship. This unfortunately makes this huge volume somewhat monochromatic, and less attractive than it might have been to those who are enchanted by the multifaceted power of Plato's philosophy.