The Oxford Handbook of the History of Analytic Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

Michael Beaney (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of the History of Analytic Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2013, 1161pp., $175.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199238842.

Reviewed by Kevin C. Klement, University of Massachusetts Amherst


This collection — or, as it may be better described, this mammoth tome — offers an expansive survey of the development of what is arguably the most successful and far reaching movement in the history of philosophy. That is, of course, if analytic philosophy can still be called a movement without stretching that term so thin as to be meaningless. The topics, figures, themes, historical trends, methodological styles, and theoretical stances addressed in this Handbook, and therefore within analytic philosophy itself, are extraordinarily diverse. It covers everything from analytic philosophy’s prehistory and ancestry in the German and English philosophical traditions of the early to mid-19th century, to quite contemporary-seeming advances in philosophical linguistics, ethics, metaphysics and political philosophy in the 1980s. (While analytic philosophy continues unabated, the dust remains too unsettled to attempt serious historical scholarship on anything more recent.)

The first four chapters — 224 pages of material — come from the editor, Michael Beaney, himself, and constitute a monograph-sized contribution on their own. His first chapter provides a summary of analytic philosophy’s origins and development, from the seeds in writers such as Bolzano and Frege, to the definite beginnings in Russell, Moore and Wittgenstein, to the increasingly diverse sub-movements that followed. Beaney also takes up the difficult problem of how best to define or characterize analytic philosophy, making note of problems with the most obvious attempts. The many references to a “linguistic turn” suggest that analytic philosophy has been particularly concerned with language, but so have many other philosophical traditions, both ancient and more recent. Analytic philosophers often pride themselves on clarity and rigor of argument, but these too fall well short of sufficient or even necessary conditions. Themes that might have seemed definitive in earlier periods, such as the advocacy of logical or conceptual analysis, or a hostility to speculative metaphysics, are far less ubiquitous in later forms of analytic philosophy.

Beaney’s second chapter deals with the historiography of analytic philosophy, that is, the self-conscious awareness of itself as a movement, and the history of its history. Noting that the founders did not self-identify using the phrase “analytic philosopher”, Beaney sketches the origins of the label in the early 1930s and its catching on widely after the Second World War. He also discusses the ever-growing extent to which analytic philosophy has turned its eye on its own history, despite its sometimes well-deserved (and sometimes not) reputation for ahistoricism. Beaney argues that there has been a “historical turn” toward more serious, academically rigorous historical treatments (as opposed to folk-tales, convenient narratives and “shadow histories”) since roughly 1990, pointing to, for example, books by Nicholas Griffin and Peter Hylton on Russell, Joan Weiner on Frege, and Thomas Baldwin on Moore.

Beaney’s next two chapters provide supplementary material. Chapter three presents an extremely useful and amazingly detailed chronology. This is organized into two charts. The first, arranged alphabetically, gives a list of 100 analytic philosophers and 50 other figures (notable philosophers in other movements and scientists and mathematicians, whose work is relevant either because of influence or by comparison), their dates, and a list of biographic references for each. The second, longer, list, arranged by year, chronicles the major publications of the figures in the first list and secondary literature about them, intertwined with their birth and death dates and locations, and other significant events such as the founding of a journal or association. This second chart is a full 73 pages long and documents everything from the publication of Kant’s first Critique and the birth of Bolzano (both in 1781) to recent events such as the founding of the Journal of the History of Analytical Philosophy in 2010 and the publication of the first full English translation of Frege’s Basic Laws of Arithmetic in 2013. Each publication noted is given a tiny description, some of which are quite humorous. (Wittgenstein’s Tractatus is met only with the written equivalent of silence, “. . .”, and citation of its final proposition; Moore’s “Proof of an External World” is aptly described with only two pictographic hands.) Beaney’s final chapter is a remarkable and sure-to-be useful 83-page bibliography of both primary and secondary sources, with works by the 150 authors from the previous chapter flagged with asterisks.

The natural assumption would be that the number of years of analytic philosophy that historians have to write about would increase by only one each year. However, one thing Beaney’s materials, together with the contributions that follow, make clear is that analytic philosophy’s history is growing in two directions. A perfect example is what Beaney calls the “canonization” of Frege. Frege was a mathematician, certainly did not work in an established analytic tradition, and died long before he could possibly have surmised that he would eventually be dubbed one of the principal founders of one. While Frege influenced a few key figures more self-consciously part of a new philosophical tradition (Russell, Wittgenstein and Carnap, especially) and thereby indirectly influenced others, prior to his work being translated into English in the 1950s and later, he was not widely read or acknowledged by the mainstream. The early historical accounts naturally began with Russell and Moore, but now Frege has become so influential that it is almost unthinkable that any reasonably comprehensive history would omit him (Scott Soames’s Philosophical Analysis in the Twentieth Century notwithstanding). It seems likely that others will be brought into the fold in similar fashion.

Bolzano is a likely next candidate for “canonization”. Certainly the account given of his philosophy in Mark Textor’s contribution reveals a thinker whose philosophical concerns, argumentative style and even key doctrines fit the analytic mould nicely. Bolzano advanced a realist account of propositions, differentiated them depending on the demonstrative or non-demonstrative nature of their content, suggested a definition of analyticity anticipating Tarski’s work on logical consequence, and described a metaphysical grounding relation between propositions reminiscent of recent developments in analytic philosophy (cf. Fine 2001, for example). Up till now, his influence on the mainstream has, like Frege’s at first, been largely indirect (proceeding through Central European figures such as Twardowski and associates in Poland). However, if his influence on the next generation of analytic philosophers is sufficiently strong, it may only be a matter of time before the starting date of analytic philosophy is pushed back a second time. The generations of Geach and Dummett helped push it from 1903 to 1879 (Frege’s Begriffsschrift); this generation may make it 1837 (the publication of Bolzano’s Wissenschaftslehre).

The 35 contributions that follow Beaney’s are divided into three parts. Part I deals with the origins of analytic philosophy. After Textor’s piece on Bolzano just mentioned, there is a piece by David Hyder dealing with 19th century philosophy of physics, geometry and causality, from Euler and Kant to Heimholtz and Hertz’s influence on Wittgenstein. The chapter covers a lot of topics in short order, and unfortunately I sometimes found it difficult to understand the connections drawn between them.

Gottfried Gabriel next outlines Frege’s too-often unacknowledged debts to the 19th Century German philosophical tradition, stressing the influence of Friedrich Adolf Trendelenburg, Johann Herbart, Hermann Lotze and Wilhelm Windelband. A later, more forward-looking piece on Frege by Tyler Burge outlines some of his major philosophical doctrines including the sense/reference distinction, the context principle, and his overall rationalist epistemology, and describes how these views have more recently come to be seen as offering profound insights for contemporary analytic philosophy and even ordinary linguistic semantics, despite decades of neglect.

John Skorupski offers a review of what he calls the “analytic school”. By this he means the tradition, much narrower than analytic philosophy as a whole, characterized by the view that philosophical, especially metaphysical, questions can be shown to be pseudo-questions by means of linguistic analysis. In it, he places Wittgenstein, the philosophers of the Vienna circle, Oxford ordinary language philosophy, as well as Quine and Putnam. Skorupski focuses on their attitudes in three areas — non-empirical epistemology, the nature of consciousness, and moral philosophy (especially meta-ethics) — and contrasts their attitudes with those of nineteenth century British philosophers, Mill especially.

Nicholas Griffin sketches, with remarkable clarity given the subject matter, the very early careers of Russell and Moore as they were educated and trained in the tradition of British Idealism of Bradley and McTaggart. Stressing Russell’s evolving views on the importance of mind-independent external relations for understanding mathematics, and Moore’s on the non-internal relationship between thought and its content, Griffin describes how they replaced their earlier views with a staunch realism focused around the notion of a proposition considered as a mind-independent unity.

Bernard Linsky presents a summary of Russell’s theory of descriptions and his “no classes” theory of class expressions according to which both descriptions and class terms are “incomplete symbols”, i.e., symbols that can be analyzed away in the context of their use. He also discusses Russell’s views on things such as matter, minds, points, instants, etc., as “logical constructions” out of other data, and suggests these are distinct notions, which only later commentators managed to separate.

Thomas Baldwin takes up the unenviable task of summarizing G. E. Moore’s philosophy, and its influence on Cambridge philosophy within his own and the next generation. What makes this task so unenviable is the varied and piecemeal approach Moore, and those he influenced, took to philosophy, tackling problems one by one with sensitivity to the nuances and distinctions each subject matter requires — an approach Baldwin himself emphasizes.

Michael Kremer takes on Wittgenstein’s early philosophy as enshrined in his influential Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus. Kremer stresses Wittgenstein’s position that the analysis of language can show philosophical questions to be meaningless or nonsensical, leading to the ethical conclusion that philosophical justification is not necessary in order to live one’s life.

Jamie Tappenden sketches the developments in 19th century mathematics that fertilized the soil from which analytic philosophy and modern logic grew. These include the need created in part by non-Euclidian geometry for a more rigorous notion of deductive consequence, and the various forms of arithmetization that made previously recondite mathematical topics ripe for logical clarification. Tappenden’s otherwise excellent contribution is marred somewhat by some rather thoughtless criticisms of Russell’s work, based in part on a rather shoddy reading of Russell’s Introduction to Mathematical Logic.

Part II, on the development of analytic philosophy, opens with a piece by Charles Travis and Mark Kalderon on Oxford realism, or the trend in philosophy at Oxford throughout the 20th century towards the view that perception and knowledge must be of something independent of mind. They sketch the origins in the work of Cook Wilson and H. A. Prichard and outline later development in Oxford philosophers such as J. L. Austin, H. P. Grice, H. H. Price, and A. J. Ayer.

Thomas Uebel follows with a description of the development of logical empiricism/logical positivism in the works of the members of the Vienna Circle (centered around Schlick and Carnap) and Berlin group (centered around Reichenbach), stressing the diversity and complexity of the movement. Uebel’s piece effectively counters the rather cartoonish caricature of logical empiricism found in contemporary discussions, owed perhaps in part to the simplifying influence of Ayer’s Language, Truth and Logic as the best known English treatment of the topic.

The development of logic from 1920-1950, especially in the works of Carnap, Tarski, and Gödel, is the topic of Erich Reck’s contribution. Reck focuses on their results in logical metatheory and formal semantics, and their influence on philosophy, especially on the theories of meaning, truth and logical syntax.

Hans-Johann Glock follows with a useful description of Wittgenstein’s later (post-Tractatus) philosophy. He sketches Wittgenstein’s abandonment of his Tractarian views, and his coming to hold a more anthropological rule- and use-based conception of language and linguistic practice, as set forth in the Philosophical Investigations. Glock also summarizes Wittgenstein’s influence and place within the analytic tradition as a whole.

Maria Baghramian and Andrew Jorgensen discuss the dismantling of the Frege/Russell “descriptivist” theory of meaning in the hands of three later figures: Quine, through his attack on the analytic/synthetic distinction, Putnam, through his “Twin Earth” arguments for semantic externalism, and Kripke, in his arguments that proper names and similar terms are rigid designators. They also briefly summarize some later empirical researches that call into question the universality of speakers’ intuitions about such matters. Their summary is quite good, but one cannot help feeling that each of these figures deserved his own chapter.

Sean Crawford describes the rise of the identity theory in the philosophy of mind (the thesis that mental states just are physical states) in the 1950s and 1960s. He also argues that the common understanding of this as having replaced a form of “logical behaviorism” on which mental states are to be defined logically in terms of dispositions toward behavior is largely a myth or “shadow history”; the views of such figures as Hempel, Carnap and Ryle were more complicated than they are now often taken to have been.

The development of theories of linguistic meaning is sketched by Alexander Miller, beginning with Frege’s theory of sense, and continuing through the works of figures such as Davidson, Wright, McDowell and Dummett. Miller’s account is quite useful, even if, by necessity given length limitations, he leaves many gaps in the story.

Stewart Candlish and Nic Damnjanovic address the development of action theory, focusing in particular on Davidson’s defense of “causalism”, the thesis that mental states such as intentions can be described non-misleadingly as causes of human action, against the background of contrary views found in Wittgenstein, Ryle and Anscombe.

Peter Simons characterizes analytic philosophy’s rather complicated relationship with metaphysics, sketching the original metaphysical concerns of Frege, Russell, Moore and the early Wittgenstein, the deflationary attitude taken by Carnap, Schlick and the other members of the Vienna circle, through the re-emergence of metaphysics as an honored analytic sub-discipline in the late 20th century writings of Quine, Strawson, Kripke, and Lewis.

Jonathan Dancy takes on the development of meta-ethics in the 20th century, and focuses on the dominance of intuitionism at Oxford and Cambridge in the early years of the century, Moore’s open question argument (and Fregean and Kripkean responses), the rise of Stevenson’s emotivism and Hare’s universal prescriptivism in the 1940s and 1950s respectively, to the emergence of a variety of new and diverse positions in the 1970s and later.

Julia Driver deals instead with developments in normative ethics. She first sketches the proliferation of more and more refined versions of utilitarianism (and consequentialism generally), virtue ethics, intuitionism and species of Kantianism, each aimed at addressing perceived flaws with older, cruder, versions. She ends by taking note of the more recent trend towards taking into account empirical research on ethical psychology and biology in normative ethics.

Analytic contributions to aesthetics are sketched in Peter Lamarque’s chapter. Lamarque describes the relatively sparse treatment of aesthetics in the early days of analytic philosophy, and goes on to discuss the broadening of interest to include the philosophy of art generally, the conceptual analysis of a variety of aesthetic concepts (beyond mere beauty), and the connection between the ontology and value of works of art with metaphysical and axiological issues more generally.

Jonathan Wolff takes on analytic political philosophy. Although many of the founders of analytic philosophy (Russell, Wittgenstein, Carnap, etc.) had political opinions and wrote widely about them, they did not do so from a particular philosophical vantage-point. It was only after the First World War that a distinctively analytic political philosophy emerged, due to the work of writers such as Popper, Braithwaite and Berlin. Analytic political philosophy reached what was arguably its high-point in the 1970s and 1980s with the work of Rawls, Nozick and Dworkin, and continues to branch out, developing even into areas in the past considered outside the analytic tradition (e.g., analytic Marxism).

Part III, “Themes in the History of Analytic Philosophy” opens with a piece by Richard Heck and Robert May on Frege’s doctrine that predicates and functional expressions represent something “unsaturated”, and are meaningful in a different way than are names of objects. They argue in part that the trouble we have understanding this claim lies in how far removed we have become from the argumentative situation Frege himself was in; it’s more that we do not understand the position Frege was arguing against than the position he in fact had.

Richard Gaskin’s piece deals with the connection alleged by Gilbert Ryle between Socrates’s dream in the Theaetetus and the logical atomism of 1918 Russell and Wittgenstein in the Tractatus. Gaskin challenges many of Ryle’s claims, and offers his own compelling analysis, though one cannot help feeling that this kind of detailed tertiary literature would be more appropriate in a journal than in a general purpose reference book.

“Reading the Tractatus with G. E. M. Anscombe” is the title of Cora Diamond’s piece. She discusses how Anscombe portrays Wittgenstein as having been influenced more by Frege than by Russell, and how Wittgenstein must not be understood as simply combining two distinct theories of meaning, a picture theory for elementary propositions, and a truth-functional theory for molecular and quantified propositions. As Anscombe reads Wittgenstein, to understand how a proposition can be a picture is to understand its capacity for truth and falsity and thus for entering in to truth operations. Diamond connects these issues to broader themes in the Tractatus, including philosophical methodology, the context principle, propositional variables, and so on. Diamond’s analysis is cogent, but like many others, Anscombe included, Diamond misportrays Russell’s influence especially in characterizing Russell as having an “object based” metaphysics as opposed to Frege’s “judgment based” metaphysics. (See Klement 2004 for criticism of this view.)

Peter Hylton addresses the notion of a logically perfect language, and the attitude towards it of various philosophers. He notes the controversy as to whether Frege and early Wittgenstein thought finding such a language could help answer, or perhaps evade, metaphysical questions. He further sketches Russell’s advocacy of such a language, Carnap’s more permissive principle of tolerance where choice of linguistic framework was only constrained by practical concerns, to Quine’s rejection of Carnap’s principle. He further suggests that contemporary philosophers who favor certain philosophical analyses of certain concepts over others may implicitly presuppose the superiority of some languages over others, even without explicitly endorsing the Russellian philosophy behind such presuppositions.

P. M. S. Hacker describes what is often called “the linguistic turn” in philosophy, or the widespread attitude that arose in the 1920s that philosophical problems can often be solved or dissolved by either close attention to, or reform of, the language used to state them. While attention to language has always been a concern of philosophers, the revolution in logic at the end of the 19th century made new ways of looking at language possible. Hacker describes “the turn” as it arose in Wittgenstein’s Tractatus and developed in the works of the logical positivists, Oxford “ordinary language philosophers”, and the later Wittgenstein, and discusses philosophy of language’s gradual drifting-away from the center position in analytic philosophy since the 1970s.

Gary Hatfield contributes a piece on the philosophy of perception, with particular emphasis on the sense-data based realisms of Moore and Russell, their forerunners and their influence. The piece also sketches later developments and criticisms, including Austin’s criticisms of sense-data theory and Sellars’s attack on “the given”. Moore’s “Proof of an External World” is given pride of place in the next contribution, by Annalisa Coliva. Coliva sketches the development of various reactions to skepticism as they play out in terms of reactions and interpretations of Moore’s paper in the work of Wittgenstein, Norman Malcolm, Thompson Clarke, Barry Stroud, Crispin Wright and Jim Pryor. She also relates this work to more recent debates around contextualism and absolutism about knowledge claims, and internalism and externalism in epistemology.

Juliet Floyd addresses analytic philosophy’s self-styled aim of increasing rigor in philosophy, and notes that what this meant is not an increase along a single dimension, but along a variety of dimensions, and she relates different conceptions of rigor in philosophy to developments in 19th century philosophy and mathematics from Kant to Moore, Dedekind and Frege to Turing.

Sanford Shieh contributes a long and important piece on the topic of modality in analytic philosophy. Shieh’s treatment runs the gamut from the skeptical or deflationary accounts of necessity given by Frege, Russell, Moore, the logical positivists, and especially, Quine, for whom the rejection of primitive modality was related to his anti-essentialism and his attack on the analytic/synthetic distinction, to the work of those philosophers who gave prominence to modal ideas, especially C. I. Lewis, Ruth Barcan Marcus and Saul Kripke.

Jaroslav Peregrin’s contribution deals with Sellars- and Brandom-style inferentialism in the theory of meaning, or roughly, the notion that the meanings of many parts of language are to be understood by means of their inferential role or similar normative proprieties. Peregrin contrasts this view with others such as representational theories of meaning. This is perhaps the narrowest of the contributions, and while I do not question its quality, it seems to me to be perhaps the most doubtful regarding its place in the volume.

The relationship between pragmatism and analytic philosophy is explored by Cheryl Misak. She focuses centrally on the works of Chauncey Wright, C. S. Peirce, William James and John Dewey, and argues that aspects of their views prefigure the skepticism about metaphysics, and focus on verifiability, found in the works of the logical positivists. She also sketches the return of many central pragmatist doctrines later in the history of analytic philosophy through, e.g., W. V. Quine’s naturalism and holism, and Richard Rorty’s anti-analytic form of pragmatism.

The final chapter, by David Woodruff Smith, examines the connections between phenomenology and analytic philosophy. Smith points out that both Husserl’s work on phenomenology and Frege’s work on logic took seed in “the same soil”, both exploring different notions of meaning or content. Smith also draws parallels between Carnap’s view on the construction (Konstitution in German) of ordinary objects and Husserl’s views of the constitution of objects in consciousness. Smith further points to the increasingly felt need among analytic philosophers for a non-formal account of meaning and even the recent acknowledgement of a distinctly analytic form of phenomenology in the recent literature.

The Handbook is a large and wonderfully useful resource. Yet, given its vast scope, there are some curious omissions. There is, for example, virtually nothing on philosophy of religion. Even if there is reason for this, it deserved mention. More troubling is the lack of a separate piece on analytic feminism, which is a large and blossoming movement. One must also be struck by the fact that of the 150 notables that Beaney includes in his list, only four are women (Anscombe, Foot, Marcus, and Susan Stebbing). These are also the only four women (besides the woman contributors) whose work is discussed at any length. In Anscombe’s case, there is (through Diamond’s contribution) more discussion of her writings about others than of her own positive philosophy. One could debate whether this was more due to the sexism of the past, making it difficult for women to advance and contribute in philosophy, or it is more due to the sexism of the present, leading us to overlook those contributions that were made by women, but the sad fact is that both of these are almost certainly to blame. E. E. Constance Jones and Alice Ambrose Lazerowitz are two women who perhaps ought to have been included on Beaney’s list, and ought to have had their work discussed in the Handbook.


Fine, Kit, (2001). “The Question of Realism”, Philosophers’ Imprint 1, pp. 1-30.

Grattan-Guinness, Ivor, (2000). The Search for Mathematical Roots 1870-1940. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Griffin, Nicholas and Bernard Linsky, eds., (2013). The Palgrave Centenary Companion to Principia Mathematica. Basingstoke: Palgrave Macmillan.

Klement, Kevin, (2004). “Putting Form Before Function: Logical Grammar in Frege, Russell and Wittgenstein”, Philosophers’ Imprint 4, pp. 1-47.

Klement, Kevin, (2010). “The Functions of Russell’s No Class Theory”, The Review of Symbolic Logic 3, pp. 633-664.

Klement, Kevin, (2013). “PM’s Circumflex, Syntax and Philosophy of Types”, in Griffin and Linsky 2013, pp. 218-46.

Landini, Gregory, (1997). Russell’s Hidden Substitutional Theory. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Landini, Gregory, (2004). “Russell’s Separation of the Logical and Semantic Paradoxes”, Revue internationale de philosophie 3, pp. 257-294.

Landini, Gregory, (2013). “Principia Mathematica: φ vs φ!”, in Griffin and Linsky 2013, pp. 163-217.

Russell, Bertrand (1901). Draft of “On the Logic of Relations with Applications in Arithmetic and the Theory of Series”, in The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, vol. 3, ed. by G. H. Moore, London: Routledge,1993, pp. 589-627.

Russell, Bertrand (1902). “General Theory of Well-Ordered Series”, reprinted in The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, vol. 3, ed. by G. H. Moore, London: Routledge, 1993, pp. 384-421.

Russell, Bertrand, (1904). “Fundamental Notions”, in The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, vol. 4, ed. by A. Urquhart. London: Routledge, 1994, pp. 111-259.